God and Morality: A Philosophical History

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John E. Hare, God and Morality: A Philosophical History, Blackwell, 2007, 309pp., $74.95 (hbk), ISBN 0631236074.

Reviewed by Robert Gressis, Postdoctoral Fellow, University of Notre Dame


John Hare writes that the purpose of God and Morality "is to look at the role theology, or thinking about God, has played in ethical theory within Western philosophy" (1). To carry out this purpose, he examines the ethical thought of four philosophers from four different eras: Aristotle, Duns Scotus, Kant, and R. M. Hare.[1] Structuring the book in this way allows Hare to offer a programmatic overview of the history of philosophical reflection on the relationship between God and morality.

Hare picks the figures he does for two reasons. First, they offer instructive examples of the contribution theism can make to ethical theorizing; second, he thinks contemporary interpreters have systematically distorted these philosophers' ethical thought (with the exception of Scotus) by downplaying their theism. Consequently, Hare sees God and Morality as "an intervention into the study of [the history of ethics], trying to correct the prevailing omission in the secondary literature of the theological context in which the various types of ethical theory originally made sense" (5).

Hare has two reasons for emphasizing the connection between these philosophers' theism and their ethical theories. First, he thinks that the fact that they are all theists of one sort or another means that they share more common ground than their secular interpreters usually realize. Second, he thinks that theism plays an important role for each philosopher's moral system; consequently, contemporary philosophers who take on Aristotelianism, Kantianism, etc., but then abandon any role for God are likely to run into serious problems that the retention of theism would have allowed them to avoid. To demonstrate this, Hare examines non-theistic versions of the four philosophers' theories: Larry Arnhart for Aristotelianism, Jean-Paul Sartre for Scotism, Christine Korsgaard for Kantianism, and Peter Singer for R. Hare's utilitarianism.[2]

In what follows, I shall briefly summarize Hare's treatments of Aristotle, Scotus, and R. M. Hare, and present Hare's account of Kant at greater length; and I shall show how the theism of each is supposed to improve the plausibility of their moral theories in comparison to their contemporary epigones. I shall also summarize Hare's own view. However, I shall not focus on Hare's interpretative differences with other scholars, nor shall I examine the ways in which their shared theism moves Aristotle, Scotus, Kant, and R. M. Hare closer to common ground.

In Chapter 1, Hare focuses mainly on the relationship between God and Aristotle's theory of virtue. Aristotle's God is a being who only thinks, and so does not intervene in earthly matters. However, God plays a role, in that the best life is one spent in contemplation of God; a virtue is any disposition that assists in the leading of this kind of life.

Larry Arnhart, a neo-Aristotelian, endorses what Hare calls the doctrine of "double identity": "the good is the desirable, and the desirable is what is generally desired by human beings" (67). However, because it does not include any role for God, Arnhart's theory faces a problem that Aristotle's does not, viz., the possibility of "tragedy": "We find tragedy whenever two natural desires conflict with no resolution by common self-interest" (70). For example, Arnhart claims that people generally desire power over others, but also that they generally desire freedom. If there were a transcendent moral norm, then tragedy could be avoided, or at least admit of a rational solution. But Arnhart denies the existence of any such moral norm, for he finds no general desire in which to ground that norm. It is here that Aristotle's theism gives his theory an advantage over Arnhart's; since the best life is one focused on God, reference to it can settle disputes about how to act and so prevent tragedy.

In Chapter 2, Hare presents Scotus's moral theory. For Scotus, it is a necessary truth that the best life is one spent loving God. However, there are many different ways in which one can love God; which route one is morally obliged to take depends on what God commands. Thus, moral obligations are constituted by divine commands, but goodness is independent of them.

Although Sartre never thought of himself as an atheistic Scotist, Hare argues that Sartreanism is what would result if one excised the theism from Scotus's theory. To appreciate the similarities between Sartre and Scotus, it helps to know that Scotus denied natural teleology: God, not nature, gives us the ends we have. Sartre also rejects natural teleology, and like Scotus claims that God's decrees would morally oblige us, if only God existed. But of course, he does not believe in God.

A second similarity is that both Scotus and Sartre think of morality as the project of trying to be like God. For Scotus, this means that people are obligated to try to will what God wills. For Sartre, "trying to be like God" means endorsing a moral system according to which the world ought to be a certain way (e.g., one in which people do not eat meat). However, Sartre not only admits that the choice of which moral system to adopt is baseless, he also claims that it is impossible to wholeheartedly endorse any moral system. Scotus's theory suffers from neither of these defects.

The interplay between Kant's religious and ethical thought is the subject of Chapter 3. In my opinion, the most significant contention of this part is that Kant is a divine command theorist ("God is the author of the obligation of the law" (144)). I should note, though, that this claim takes up only a small part of the chapter; consequently, given the claim's iconoclasm, I am not fully convinced that I am interpreting Hare correctly here.

There is reason to doubt the attribution of divine command theory to Kant. First, Kant is commonly thought to argue against divine command theory at Groundwork, 4:443. Second, every Kant scholar I am aware of sees Kant either as a moral constructivist or a moral realist, and both possibilities seem to rule out divine command theory. If we, as the constructivist thinks, have moral obligations because we will them, then it cannot also be the case that we have moral obligations because God so decrees.[3] And if people have moral obligations regardless of what anybody thinks, as the realist thinks, then God's decrees play no role. Between these two interpretive options, moral realism seems more likely, for Hare quotes Kant as saying (in his 1784 lectures on ethics) that "the moral law is as necessary as the proposition that a triangle has three angles" (143).

Against the first point, Hare makes a plausible case that Kant in the Groundwork rejects only Crusius's version of divine command theory, not every form of it. As for the second point, I think Hare is correct to reject constructivist interpretations of Kant. But although Kant takes the moral law to be necessary, he is not obviously a realist, for he also "accepts the view, throughout his life, that we should recognize our obligations as God's commands" (152). A realist could take this passage to mean that belief in God is necessary for moral motivation; but how is divine command theory compatible with the belief that the moral law is necessary?

Hare could argue as follows. The moral law does not prescribe duties; rather, it describes how free, holy beings (i.e., beings who have no inclinations or whose reason perfectly controls their inclinations) act. The reason we -- free beings whose reason does not perfectly control our inclinations -- are supposed to follow the moral law is that God commands it. However, because I have not seen anything like this argument in Kant (he seems instead to argue that we should obey the moral law because we are free beings, so it is our law)[4] I am skeptical of Hare's proposal.

On Korsgaard's view, people have reasons to act because they have "practical identities" (e.g., as a spouse, philosopher, etc.). These identities bring with them norms that one must obey on pain of losing the identity. While practical identities explain why we have obligations, ending the story there makes it the case that someone with an identity as a Mafioso really has obligations to steal, murder, etc. And that is implausible.

If Kant is a divine command theorist, he can avoid this problem; but he can also avoid it if he is a realist. And it is not as though Korsgaard has not thought of this; she does not take moral realism to be a viable option, though, both because it is metaphysically implausible, and because it is not obvious how it can explain why moral facts are authoritative for us. It seems to me that these criticisms tell against divine command theory as well.[5]

Chapter 4 is a particularly valuable chapter, not only because it is the first "treatment in English of R. M. Hare's overall moral theory", but also because it describes R. M. Hare's early, unpublished "An Essay on Monism". One theme that emerges from this chapter is that R. Hare made greater room for religious belief (especially in "An Essay on Monism") than is usually noted. Not only is R. Hare's "archangel", the model of moral reasoning to which we aspire, a proxy for God (it is perfectly rational, impartial, sympathetic, informed), but R. M. Hare had an abiding faith "that the world is the kind of place in which it is worthwhile trying to be morally good", which he called "faith in Providence" (243).

The cost of abandoning faith in Providence is underlined in Hare's treatment of one of R. M. Hare's students, Peter Singer. Like R. M. Hare, Singer endorses a moral theory according to which we should maximize the satisfaction of preferences. Given the inequality of the distribution of resources, this entails massive personal sacrifices on the part of the world's wealthy for the sake of the world's poor. Without faith in Providence, morality will seem too demanding (at least for the wealthy); with faith in Providence, one can believe that the happiness one gives up now will be made up for later.

Chapter 5 offers a sketch of Hare's own, as-of-yet-incomplete moral theory, which draws from the moral theories of each of his four subjects. He formulates his theory this way not only because he thinks there is much to be learned from the four philosophers, but also "to defend the claim that the types of theory I have discussed can be combined more easily when the original theistic premises are retained" (249).

Hare's ethics contains three elements. First, following both Aristotle and Scotus, the greatest good for any individual is a life spent in union with God. Moreover, things that are good are good because of how they relate to God: either they resemble God, draw us to God, foreshadow a life with God, etc. Second, following Scotus and (in Hare's view) Kant, moral obligations are constituted by God's commands. So, although there are many paths an individual can take to end up spending his life (and afterlife) in union with God, the path it is morally obligatory for one to take depends on which one God commands one to take. Finally, following Kant and R. Hare, to actually try to live a morally good life (which involves not just trying to love God but also trying to promote the happiness of others) we must believe it is possible to succeed in our endeavors; and for this, a faith in God's providence is required.

Hare's book is valuable for showing the variety of ways in which theism can strengthen moral theory. And the chapter on R. M. Hare is exceptionally useful. The book has two defects, though. First, although Hare is a gifted stylist, capable of making complex philosophical theories clear, the book's chapters are structured in a way that often makes it difficult to grasp what larger point Hare is making (this is perhaps due to the fact that Hare pursues so many different themes). Second, it is not clear to me at what audience God and Morality is directed. It is part of a series entitled "First Books in Philosophy", giving the impression that it should be used in introductory or intermediate undergraduate classes. Hare, however, writes that it "is offered as perhaps a third book in philosophy, neither baby food nor titillating for the epicure (though the footnotes try to accommodate a more exacting taste)" (5). I am not entirely sure what this means, but I believe with suitable guidance it could be used in an upper-level history of ethics course.[6]

[1] I shall refer to John Hare simply as "Hare" and R. M. Hare as "R. Hare".

[2] It should be noted that I have put things a little stronger than Hare. While he is personally convinced that theism allows plausible moral theories to avoid some serious problems, he does not take himself to have shown that in this book. Instead, he shows that theism would at least allow Arnhart, Sartre, Korsgaard, and Singer to avoid some problems he notes for their theories.

[3] A possible hybrid position is that we have moral obligations because we and God create them together. But anyone who asserted this would not think that moral obligations exist solely because God wills them, and so would not be a divine command theorist.

[4] For example, "it is there [in the intelligible world], as intelligence only, that [the human being] is his proper self (as a human being he is only the appearance of himself)" (Groundwork, 4:457).

[5] Admittedly, the divine command theorist can also say that we ought to follow God's commands because God is perfectly loving. But this does not obviously explain why God's commands are authoritative for us, as opposed to simply being in our long-term self-interest.

[6] I would like to thank Chris Dodsworth and Faith Pawl for their assistance on this review.