God's Own Ethics: Norms of Divine Agency and the Argument from Evil

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Mark C. Murphy, God's Own Ethics: Norms of Divine Agency and the Argument from Evil, Oxford University Press, 210 pp., $70.00, ISBN 9780198796916.

Reviewed by Craig Duncan, Ithaca College


Suppose that I stumble upon a machine with a button labeled "Malaria Be Gone." It is a magic button, it turns out, that only I can press. If I press it, then malaria will go the way of smallpox, disappearing with no counterproductive ecological or social effects. However, I choose not to press the button. When asked why not, I reply: "I have no wish to concern myself with malaria, even for the moment it takes me to press the button." This would be puzzling behavior on my part. Surely the tremendous human suffering that malaria causes is a strong reason for any person to eradicate it if he or she easily could, unless eradicating malaria for some reason impedes that person's progress on an even worthier goal. My indifferent reply, by contrast, suggests that I am oblivious to this strong reason. To that extent, my decision-making is far from perfect.

Next note that God, a perfect being, also has the power to eradicate malaria from the world, and also chooses not to do so. Why is this not an imperfect decision on God's part, as it was for me? There are familiar answers in the literature on the problem of evil, e.g. theodicy (because disease makes possible greater goods of compassion, courage, etc.) and skeptical theism (given the gulf between God's intellectual powers and ours, we simply cannot comprehend God's greater good in permitting malaria). In his highly original book, Mark C. Murphy explores a strategy for responding to the problem of evil that is distinct from theodicy and skeptical theism. According to this strategy, God is no less perfect for choosing to allow malaria (or other forms of human suffering) in the world, even if no greater good is served by malaria. This is because, according to Murphy, there is no reason requiring a perfect being to concern itself with creaturely well-being, and thus, a perfect being is under no obligation to promote creaturely well-being. God's Own Ethics is Murphy's book-length defense of this surprising claim. While I was not persuaded by Murphy's defense, his exploration of this topic is intriguing and provocative. His book deserves to be widely read and discussed by philosophers of religion.

I begin with a summary of the argument. In Chapter 1, Murphy articulates and defends a conception of God as "an absolutely perfect being" (9). He refers to a being who instantiates this conception as "the Anselmian being." A key claim of this chapter is that "in characterizing the perfections of the Anselmian being, we should conceive of them as 'pressing outward'" (21). This means that "there is rational pressure toward characterizing the Anselmian perfections in a substantively more expansive way" (ibid.). An example is clarifying. For instance, debate exists over whether "counterfactuals of freedom" have truth-values. According to Murphy, God would be greater in a case where such truth-values exist and God knows them, as opposed to a case in which God lacks this knowledge because it is metaphysically impossible. This fact about greatness, says Murphy, counts as a reason (though not by itself a conclusive reason) for thinking that it is indeed metaphysically possible for counterfactuals of freedom to have truth-values. The general lesson is this: in a case where there is more than one reasonable conception defining what levels of an Anselmian perfection are metaphysically possible, we should favor the more expansive conception of metaphysical possibility, since God is greater on that more expansive account.

Chapter 2 raises the question of to what extent the Anselmian being must be loving. One might think the answer is "maximally so," on the grounds that love is a perfection and the Anselmian being necessarily has all perfections to a maximal degree. This simple answer is not Murphy's answer, however. Instead, in Chapter 2 he aims to establish that the only senses in which being loving can necessarily be ascribed to the Anselmian being are the senses that are strictly entailed by the Anselmian being's moral goodness. Thus, Chapter 2 concludes that we should focus on the moral goodness of the Anselmian being if we wish to understand how this being necessarily behaves toward human creatures.

Accordingly, Chapter 3 focuses on moral goodness, as do Chapters 4 and 5. The argument of Chapter 3 is negative; it aims to show that good grounds exist for doubting that the Anselmian being necessarily exhibits moral goodness "in the familiar welfare-oriented sense" (45), that is, in a sense that enjoins agents to promote human well-being and perfection (i.e. human excellence) as well as prevent setbacks to these. One main aim of this chapter is to reject Kantian-style consistency arguments according to which welfare-oriented moral obligations are inherent to rationality itself, for such arguments would entail (contrary to Chapter 3's claim) that God as supremely rational must be obligated to promote welfare. In response to this threat, Murphy stresses the vast gulf between the Anselmian being and finite creatures:

It is not enough that the value [of rational agency] be present; it has to give to the Anselmian being the same sort of reasons that it gives to finite rational beings. And the massive difference between finite rational agents and the Anselmian being should make one doubt whether one is committed, as a matter of consistency or on pain of arbitrariness, to holding that the Anselmian being must have such reasons. (56-57)

Thus, even if a Kantian consistency argument can be made to work for agents who stand in a relation of equality vis-à-vis one another, Murphy argues that we cannot generalize this argument to the Anselmian being. This result (together with Chapter 3's similarly skeptical examinations of Hobbesian, Humean, and Aristotelian accounts of practical reason) is enough, says Murphy, to establish reasonable doubt as to whether God's ethics must recognize the familiar duty to promote well-being/perfection.

Chapter 4 seeks to transform this reason to doubt whether God's ethics is like ours into a positive reason to believe that God's ethics is not like ours. At the heart of Chapter 4 is a distinction borrowed from Joshua Gert, namely, a distinction between a "requiring reason" and a "justifying reason" (59).[1] Briefly, a requiring reason to ɸ is a reason that makes it irrational for one not to ɸ, other things equal. By contrast, a justifying reason to ɸ makes ɸ-ing rationally optional: other things equal, one can rationally ɸ, but one can rationally not-ɸ instead, if one so chooses. With this distinction in hand, Murphy claims that the well-being/perfection of creatures gives the Anselmian being justifying reasons to promote well-being/perfection but not requiring reasons to promote well-being/perfection. This means that the promotion of well-being/perfection is a rational option for the Anselmian being rather than a rational requirement.

The case for the Anselmian being's lack of requiring reasons to promote well-being/perfection flows from Murphy's account of the perfection of divine sovereignty, together with the methodological principle from Chapter 1 mentioned above, which insists that our conceptions of the divine perfections "should press outward" (72). According to Murphy, the more discretionary choice that the Anselmian being has, the greater the sovereignty that that being exhibits. The methodological principle thus entails that, if there are multiple reasonable conceptions of the moral duties that bind the Anselmian being, then from among those conceptions, there exists rational pressure to choose the conception that leaves the Anselmian being the widest range of free action. Recall that according to Murphy, Chapter 3 showed that there is no decisive objection to a permissive conception of divine ethics according to which God lacks familiar welfare-oriented duties of care. Thus, the methodological principle instructs us to adopt this permissive conception, since it leads to greater freedom and, hence, to a greater degree of sovereignty.

In case one blanches at the claim that the permissive conception of divine ethics is a reasonable conception, Murphy offers a supporting argument. After all, a critic might say, doesn't the promotion of creaturely well-being/perfection increase the amount of intrinsic value in the universe, and wouldn't it be irrational for the Anselmian being to be unmoved by that potential increase in value? In reply, Murphy offers an account of intrinsic value according to which the Anselmian being, as the source of value in the universe, contains the whole of intrinsic value within itself. The goodness of anything else, including creatures like you and me, is good only "by way of participation in that being's goodness" (76). This means that there is always the same level of intrinsic value in the universe, namely, the perfect level inherent in the Anselmian being itself. An increase in creaturely well-being merely alters the mode in which this perfect intrinsic value manifests itself in the universe. Since there is no increase in value, the case for the rational necessity of the Anselmian being to promote well-being/perfection is undercut.

However, Murphy's account of God's own ethics is not an ethics of pure permission. The Anselmian being, claims Murphy, is subject to one sort of decisive requiring reason, namely, a decisive requiring reason never to intend evil, understanding "evil" as the "absence of due perfection or due well-being" (86). Chapter 5 aims to establish this claim. In service of this aim, Murphy defends the coherence of the intended/foreseen distinction in ethics, and argues that we need this distinction to define what makes a given action successful or not: "The success conditions of an action are defined by the intended end and the means intended to realize that end. The success conditions for an action are not defined by the merely foreseen" (96). Given this fact, and given that "one's agency is made worse by having evils among the success conditions of one's actions" (98), it follows that for the Anselmian being to intend evil would be for its agency to be, per impossible, worse than it might otherwise be. Hence, Murphy concludes that the Anselmian being has a decisive requiring reason not to intend evil.

Chapter 5's defense of rational restrictions on divinely permissible agency, however, threatens to rehabilitate the argument from evil. For might not the atheist claim that the undue suffering experienced by so many creatures shows that God must intend that suffering? Hence, a main aim of Chapter 6 is to show that the suffering of the world is consistent with God having requiring reasons never to intend evil. Murphy is skeptical that the atheist will be able to show that undue suffering in the world must be divinely intended, as opposed to merely divinely-foreseen-but-not-intended. "Perhaps if the evils exhibited in this world displayed some sort of pattern that could be only the work of a providential evil-intender, a case could be constructed -- a sort of argument from evil design -- but that is not our world," claims Murphy (117).

With Chapter 6, Part 1 concludes. However, Part 1's account of divine ethics comes with some risk -- in particular, the risk that the Anselmian being may now appear so remote and alien as to call into question whether we have reason to worship that being and give it our allegiance. Part 2 aims to allay these worries, by arguing (i) that the Anselmian being's perfection still makes it necessarily supremely worthy of worship, and (ii) that although the Anselmian being's necessary properties don't necessarily make that being worthy of allegiance, the Anselmian being can contingently take on additional duties of creaturely care that indeed make it supremely worthy of our allegiance.

Chapter 7 contains Murphy's argument that the Anselmian being's perfection by itself entails that that being is worship-worthy, but does not by itself entail that that being is allegiance-worthy. The basic worry regarding allegiance is that since the Anselmian being's goals are possibly very remote from our goals, there may not be adequate scope for the sort of sharing-of-goals that is inherent to rational allegiance. However, argues Murphy, it is possible for the Anselmian being to adopt a "contingent ethics" to supplement the ethics that necessarily flows from its perfection, and this contingent ethics thereby makes that being supremely worthy of our allegiance.

Chapter 8 aims to define the type of contingent ethics by which the Anselmian being can make itself supremely worthy of allegiance. According to Murphy, it is as follows:

Now suppose that the Anselmian being has a contingent ethics such that (a) the Anselmian being does not will that we act in ways that the norms of practical reasonableness forbid of us and (b) whatever further the Anselmian being wills with respect to created rational beings is such that for each creature, subordinating the creaturely will to the Anselmian being's will enables that creature to act in a rationally preferable way with respect to the ends set by those norms of practical reasonableness. In these circumstances, it seems to me that there is an overwhelmingly strong case for the worthiness of the Anselmian being for us to be obedient to that being's will. (168)

However, even if Murphy is right that such a contingent ethics on the part of the Anselmian being ought to inspire our allegiance, how could that being acquire such an ethics? According to Murphy, by self-imposition: the Anselmian being could "perform some act of will that subjects the Anselmian being to standards of nondefectiveness in action that go beyond those that hold necessarily of the Anselmian being" (173). Murphy considers two sorts of acts of will that he claims meet this condition, namely, a high-level rational intention to achieve a given end, and an act of promising.

Of course, for the Anselmian being simply to promise, say, to maximally promote human well-being/perfection would be for the argument from evil to rear its head again with its initial force wholly intact. To head off this threat, Murphy in Chapter 9 claims that "we can exploit the gap between the ethics that is necessary for the Anselmian being to be fully worthy of allegiance and the ethics that is necessary for the Anselmian being to be motivated along the lines of familiar welfare-oriented moral goodness" (181). Murphy's central claim is that the Anselmian being can be fully worthy of allegiance without needing to promise that it will prevent each possible setback to human well-being. In this vein, Murphy considers the following divine commitment:

the Anselmian being's ethics might involve conditionally willing with respect to every created agent: for each agent who (freely) subordinates its will to my own, that created agent's ultimate good -- that is, the created agent's well-being in his or her life as a whole -- will be better realized for him or her. (185)

Such a being, claims Murphy, wholly deserves our allegiance and yet -- because the commitment is simply that one's life as a whole goes better by following God's will than it would without following God's will -- there is no implication that by following God's will one's life will have minimal suffering. Note, too, that Murphy understands one's "life as a whole" to include one's post-mortem existence as well as one's earthly existence. Thus, an atheist cannot adduce, as evidence for God's non-existence, the case of (say) a devout person whose earthly life was so full of extreme suffering that no one could reasonably judge that person's earthly life on the whole to have gone well. Given an eternal afterlife, there is plenty of time for God's promise of a valuable life on the whole to be made good. Thus, judges Murphy, the atheist's objection is lacking in force, and the argument from evil is defeated.

This concludes my overview of the book's main arguments. I turn now to describe my judgment of its strengths and weaknesses. The book's main strength lies in its originality. The claim that God has no necessary duties of care with respect to creaturely well-being is a bold and provocative thesis, and Murphy defends the thesis with great ingenuity, as I believe the summary above shows. Another strength lies in the sophistication with which Murphy executes his defense. His level of mastery of both the practical reason literature and the philosophy of religion literature is impressive, and this mastery enables him to make many nuanced and insightful points in support of his surprising thesis.

Despite these strengths, I was left far short of being persuaded, for a number of reasons. One worry concerns Murphy's picture of practical reasoning. We have seen how his argument relies heavily on the contrast between a "justifying reason" and a "requiring reason." Murphy's explanation of this distinction is regrettably brief. It occurs in just a single paragraph on page 59, which contains no examples of each type of reason in everyday life. Surely, though, more defense of this key distinction is needed, especially since the notion of a justifying reason is in conflict with a much more mainstream view of reasons, according to which reasons are characterized by degrees of strength, with rationality requiring one to perform the action favored by the strongest set of reasons. What revisions to mainstream models of reasons must one accept, then, in order to believe in justifying reasons? The reader is not told, and thus on the basis of Murphy's book, the reader is not in a good position to judge whether this absolutely vital concept is in fact a credible one. Moreover, there are other attempts besides Gert's to make sense of actions that are allegedly rationally-permissible-but-not-required, e.g. Joseph Raz's exploration of incommensurable reasons and Douglas Portmore's notion of an "imperfect reason."[2] Are these alternative ideas also compatible with Murphy's account of God's own ethics, or does his argument specifically require Gert's idea of a justifying reason? That is unclear, and counts as a missed opportunity in my judgment.

A second main worry I have concerns the key claim that the Anselmian being's possession of a requiring reason to promote well-being/perfection would conflict with that being's perfect sovereignty. I am unconvinced by Murphy's argument that as regards divine sovereignty, an asymmetry exists between (i) a requiring reason never to intend the absence of due well-being/perfection, and (ii) a requiring reason to promote due well-being/perfection. According to Murphy, whereas the existence of the latter reason would unduly limit divine sovereignty, the existence of the former reason does not. Making use of his argument that intending evil is incompatible with goodness, Murphy states:

That the Anselmian being's own goodness necessitates the Anselmian being not to act in certain ways, should the Anselmian being choose to act at all with respect to creatures, does not seem to me to be a limit to the Anselmian being's valuable discretion; that creaturely goodness necessitates the Anselmian being to act at all does seem to me to be such a limit. (102)

The idea here is that whereas the goodness of finite creatures ought not to limit divine discretion (as would happen if the Anselmian being has a duty to promote creaturely well-being), it is appropriate for the Anselmian being's own goodness to limit it.

However, this way of describing the contrast seems strained. For Murphy frequently describes the contrast between a duty to increases well-being/perfection versus a duty never to intend evil as the contrast between a duty to promote value versus a duty to respect value (e.g. 58-59, 85-6). But if a duty to respect creaturely good counts as an appropriate limit on divine discretion, then why doesn't a duty to promote creaturely good likewise count as an appropriate limit? This seems a slender distinction on which to rest the argument. Moreover, here is an alternative way of expressing this skeptical worry, which mirrors an alternative way in which Murphy expresses his point. Murphy says that intending evil would be incompatible with the Anselmian being's holiness (100, 102). Thus, a duty never to intend evil, being built-in to holiness, is an appropriate limit on divine discretion. However, denying (as Murphy does) that a duty to promote due well-being/perfection applies to the Anselmian being entails, I believe, that the Anselmian being can rationally be indifferent to evil (i.e. undue absence of well-being/perfection). But if so, then to preserve the relevant asymmetry, Murphy must argue -- implausibly, by my lights -- that whereas intending evil is incompatible with holiness, indifference to evil is compatible with it.[3]

These worries regarding the core idea of a justifying reason and the core idea of divine sovereignty lead me to doubt that Murphy's book poses a genuine threat to the argument from evil. Moreover, there are other worries I lack sufficient space to describe, regarding, for instance, Murphy's claim that humans (and human well-being) are not intrinsically valuable, his application of the intention/foresight distinction to the Anselmian being, and his claim that none of the undue suffering of the world need be divinely intended. I will only allow myself a brief comment on this last worry. Murphy senses that evolution by natural selection poses a challenge to his view. For instance, he concedes that evolution was God's chosen means for realizing God's intention of creating humans; this in turn entails that evolution itself was divinely intended (120). However, since suffering seems inherent to evolution (since creatures evolve via a struggle for survival in which losers die out), doesn't this divine intention entail that God intends creaturely suffering after all? Murphy denies this. In choosing evolution as the means of creating humans, he says, God makes use of the premature death of human precursors rather than intending their deaths (ibid.). However, this strikes me as too tenuous a distinction to do the work that Murphy wishes it to do.

Despite all these reservations, I am glad that this book was written, for I look forward to the discussion it will undoubtedly inspire. Our understanding of the argument from evil has progressed greatly in the last half century or so -- witness, for instance, the distinctions between the logical problem of evil and the evidential problem of evil, and between theodicies and skeptical theism. I believe that further exploration of the idea of "God's own ethics" will lead to yet more progress in our understanding of the argument from evil, and Murphy has surely helped us down this path of progress.


I would like to thank Samuel Pfeiffer for helpful advice on an earlier version of this review.

[1] Joshua Gert, Brute Rationality (Cambridge University Press, 2004), 19-39.

[2] Joseph Raz, Engaging Reason: On the Theory of Value and Action (Oxford University Press, 1999), 46-66; Douglas W. Portmore, "Imperfect Reasons and Rational Options," Noûs 46:1 (2012): 24-60.

[3] Skepticism about the alleged asymmetry leads me to judge that divine sovereignty is compatible with the existence of both requiring reasons to respect creaturely good and to promote creaturely good. Note, though, that the asymmetry could be broken in the opposite direction, namely, by insisting that God's sovereignty is compatible with no requiring reasons. This seems, for instance, to have been Martin Luther's view: "God is he for whose will no cause or ground can be laid down as its rule or standard; for nothing is on a level with it or above it, but it is itself the rule for all things. If any rule or standard, or cause or ground, existed for it, it could no longer be the will of God. What God wills is not right because He ought, or was bound, so to will; on the contrary, what takes place must be right, because He so wills it. Causes and grounds are laid down for the will of the creature, but not for the will of the Creator -- unless you set another creator over him!" (Martin Luther, The Bondage of the Will, trans. J. I. Packer and O. R. Johnston; Baker Academic [1525; 1957] 2012, 209.)