Good Knowledge, Bad Knowledge: On Two Dogmas of Epistemology

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Hetherington, Stephen, Good Knowledge, Bad Knowledge: On Two Dogmas of Epistemology, Oxford University Press, 2001, 209pp, $45 (hbk), ISBN 0-19-924734-X.

Reviewed by Richard Feldman, University of Rochester


In this lively and provocative book Stephen Hetherington sets out to refute two views that he regards as dogmas of contemporary epistemology and to show that several prominent epistemological issues can be better understood once those dogmas are rejected. The dogmas are "absolutism" and "justificationism". Absolutism is the view that:

Knowledge is absolute, in the sense that it is impossible for a person to have better, or to have worse, knowledge of a fact. (p. 3)

Justificationism is the thesis that:

Knowledge does entail justification. (p. 110)

In this brief review, I will summarize Hetherington's objections to these two dogmas, describe the implications he draws from their rejection, and then raise a few critical points about the book.

In Chapter 1 Hetherington formulates his case against absolutism. He begins by noting that we routinely accept that we can know two people, yet know one better than another, and that we can know how to do two things, yet know how to do one better than the other. In contrast, many of us balk at the idea that we know one fact better than another fact. Of course, everyone would agree that the consequences of our having some knowledge (e.g., that adopting a particular policy will bring about world peace) would be better than those of our having some other knowledge (e.g., that my penny jar has an even number of coins). But this is not what Hetherington has in mind. As he puts it, what absolutism denies is that some cases of knowledge are "better as knowledge" than others. (p. 7) According to Hetherington, absolutism is left implicit in the writings of most epistemologists. He mentions only Ryle and Dretske as explicit advocates of the doctrine, and rightly argues that their defenses are less than decisive.

Against absolutism, Hetherington repeatedly uses examples such as the following: suppose you are at the zoo and you know that you are seeing some zebras. He writes,

You could learn more about what zebras are like in general, about the histories of the zebras in front of you, etc. This would improve your knowledge about zebras in general. Yet by having more knowledge about zebras in general, you also have better knowledge that you are seeing some zebras … you have a better understanding of what it is that you are believing about your immediate environment. (p. 22)

Hetherington says that how good your knowledge is depends upon how well justified your true belief is. This is made fully explicit by a graph in Chapter 5. (p. 149) I will return to the rejection of absolutism later in this review.

In Chapter 2 Hetherington applies the idea of good knowledge and bad knowledge to arguments about skepticism. I cannot do justice to the entire discussion here. His central idea is that in a typical skeptical argument there appears a premise such as:

D1. You know that you are seeing zebras, only if you know that you are not dreaming that you are seeing zebras.

The argument continues by asserting that you do not know that you are not dreaming and thus do not know that you are seeing zebras. Hetherington contends that "D1 is false because it fails to distinguish between (1) your having poorer or lesser knowledge that you are seeing zebras and (2) your having richer or better knowledge that you are seeing zebras."(p. 34) At this stage of the book, Hetherington accepts the idea that knowledge requires eliminating alternatives, yet maintains that it is not the case that to know one must eliminate all alternatives. Rather, the more alternatives one can eliminate, the better one's knowledge. (p. 35) Presumably, then, he thinks that one can have at least decent knowledge that one is seeing zebras without being able to eliminate (and without knowing) that one is not dreaming. Contrary to relevant alternatives theorists, Hetherington holds that all alternatives are relevant, but not to whether one does know but rather to how well one knows. And skeptics, therefore, do have a point worth noting. In calling attention to skeptical alternatives, they succeed in showing that our knowledge is less than perfect knowledge. So skeptics are not simply mistaken. Instead, they overstate the implications of their insights.

In Chapter 3, Hetherington turns to the Gettier problem. His central contention is that the believers in Gettier cases do have knowledge, but it is highly "failable" (not "fallible") knowledge. Roughly, one has failable knowledge when one could easily not have had knowledge. For example, if one has a justified true belief, but could easily have had a justified false belief, then one's knowledge is failable. This is true in the Gettier cases. The fortuitous event that made the belief true could easily have failed to occur. Hetherington claims that highly failable knowledge is poor knowledge. (p. 88) He also says that in Gettier cases, the believers are not very well justified. (p. 89) The reason we are inclined to think that Gettier cases are not cases of knowledge is that they are borderline cases of knowledge (being so highly failable), and "mistakes easily occur" at the boundaries of concepts. (p. 87)

In Chapter 4 Hetherington introduces the concept of minimal knowledge, and turns to the second dogma of contemporary epistemology, justificationism. His view is that any case of true belief is a case of knowledge, though if the belief is not justified, then it is minimal knowledge. I found the discussion of this material somewhat confusing. Hetherington introduces a definition of knowledge as true belief (principle (TB)), and says we need not accept it. (p. 132) He goes on to accept a modified principle, (TB*), according to which cases of unjustified true belief are minimal knowledge and cases of justified true belief are better knowledge. I am not sure why Hetherington does not accept (TB). He is committed to the view that there are no counterexamples to it. Perhaps his point is that it gives an incomplete account of the concept of knowledge.

Key to Hetherington's rejection of justification are cases of "exam knowledge" in which people give the right answer to a test question without being justified in believing that answer. (Section 4.2) Hetherington also argues that justificationism in effect implies that to know a specific fact, one must know a great many facts on the topic of that fact. For example, reliabilism implies that to know one thing a person must be reliable about that general topic (p. 116) and evidentialist theories imply that to know one thing a person must have (and thus know) a body of evidence about that topic (p. 120). But these analyses get things backwards, he contends. By knowing a lot of individual facts about a topic, you may get to know about that topic. However, you do not have to know about the topic in order to know an individual fact. Hetherington is avowedly neutral about recent debates on the nature of justification. Whatever your favorite theory of justification-reliabilism, the causal theory, evidentialism-his view is that knowledge does not require that sort of justification.

This chapter also contains an interesting discussion of sorites arguments on these issues. (Section 4.3) One might argue that knowledge does not require justification on the grounds that there is no tiny loss of justification that is sufficient to push one over the threshold from knowledge to non-knowledge. Hetherington rejects this argument, and points out that one might equally well argue that since there is no threshold in degree of belief required for knowledge, knowledge does not require any degree of belief or that, if truth comes in degrees, since there is no degree of truth that marks the threshold between knowledge and non-knowledge, knowledge does not require truth.

In Chapter 5 Hetherington reviews various grades of knowledge and defends "epistemic gradualism," the idea that there are many grades or degrees of knowledge. The chapter also contains further discussion of examples in which people guess correct answers. Hetherington points out that he is not committed to the view that a person who guesses the correct answer to a test question thereby knows the answer, since guessers typically do not even believe the answers they give. The chapter includes a discussion of G.E. Moore's response to skepticism.

In the final chapter, Hetherington discusses knowledge about knowledge. He rejects the thesis that when I know something, I always know that I know it. He uses the existence of better and worse knowledge to diffuse the problem of the criterion. The book concludes with a discussion of Barry Stroud's views about skepticism.

Good Knowledge, Bad Knowledge is an interesting and provocative book, defending novel views about a wide range of issues in contemporary epistemology. It is written in a clear and straightforward manner, and is devoid of unnecessary technicalities. Hetherington is always clear about what he is arguing for and candid about what he thinks he has established and what he has not. I found it to be an enjoyable book to read. Nevertheless, I am not persuaded by the central arguments.

For one thing, I am less than clear about exactly what the issue concerning absolutism actually amounts to. It is true that epistemologists are much more apt to talk about degrees of knowing how and degrees of knowing people than they are to talk of better or worse knowledge. But fallibilism is widely accepted, and this implies that beliefs that are less than completely certain can be knowledge. It is therefore rather uncontroversial that some items of knowledge can be better justified than others. And if one wants to say that knowledge that involves better justification is better knowledge, then that strikes me as rather benign. I do not see what exactly denying this would imply.

Hetherington's account of what makes one item of knowledge better than another is notably variable. The official doctrine seems to be that quality of knowledge varies with strength of justification. However, he also suggests that one's true belief that p at a given time is a case of good knowledge when it is clearly a case of knowledge (p. 5), when one knows many related facts (p. 9), when one can eliminate a lot of alternatives to p (p. 35), when one's knowledge is not highly failable (p. 88), when one knows p at other times (p. 158), when there is a suitable causal connection between the facts and one's belief (p. 162), and when one knows that one knows (p. 184). These are, of course, different considerations. It is worth noting that it is rather easy to meet some of these conditions for good knowledge, given that mere true belief is knowledge. For example, if you have an unjustified true belief, and think that you have knowledge, then you do know that you know (since you have a true belief to that effect). Furthermore, there are puzzling implications: an unjustified true belief is better knowledge if it is stubbornly held rather than transient.

I think that Hetherington's contentions about skepticism and the Gettier problem are independent of his claims about absolutism. His point about skepticism is that skeptical considerations show that our beliefs are not as well justified as we might have thought, but that they still qualify as knowledge. It adds little to say that we have worse knowledge than we thought. Furthermore, Hetherington's claims about skepticism are puzzling. He says that when looking at a zebra at the zoo, the typical person can eliminate many alternatives, but not the alternative that he is dreaming. However, he never says clearly what it takes to "eliminate" an alternative and he does not explain why one cannot eliminate the dream possibility by deducing it from the known fact that one is seeing zebras. Moreover, in light of Hetherington's view that true belief is (minimal) knowledge, he is committed to something very close to (D1): If you know that you are seeing zebras, then, if you believe that you are not dreaming, then you know that you are not dreaming.

One does not need to reject absolutism to respond to Gettier cases by claiming that the people do have knowledge. I do not find that response convincing, but adding that it is poor knowledge does not help. Hetherington defends his view by suggesting that Gettier cases are borderline cases of knowledge about which we are likely to be confused. They are borderline cases, he says, because the victims are not very well justified in their beliefs in the target propositions. This seems wrong, since Gettier victims can have very well justified beliefs. Furthermore, borderline cases are apt to cause confusion and highly varied responses, yet, as Hetherington notes, responses to Gettier cases seem to be remarkably uniform.

Hetherington's account also allows for odd results, though results Hetherington would probably accept. Thus, consider Chisholm's well-known case in which a person sees something (e.g., a dog) that looks exactly like a sheep in the field and justifiably believes that there is a sheep in the field. There is a sheep, but it is out of sight. If the sheep were near the boundary of the field, and quickly wandering in and out of the field, (or on a merry-go-round only partly in the field), Hetherington's view would have it that he is alternating between knowing and not knowing that there is a sheep in the field while intently staring at the dog.

I will end this review with two brief comments on justificationism. First, Hetherington's view renders false things that seem to be truisms about knowledge. For example, imagine two candidates interviewed during a competitive election campaign. Each says that she thinks that she will win, but no one will know the winner until election day. On Hetherington's view, however, the one who will win does already (minimally) know that she will win. Second, in discussing minimal knowledge Hetherington focuses on cases of guessing, where one has little or no evidence. But there are also cases in which one has strong evidence against a believed proposition. His view implies that a person who believes the truth in the face of the evidence, whether it be out of wishful thinking, paranoia, or gross logical blunder, nevertheless has knowledge. The rejection of justificationism would have been strengthened had such matters been more directly addressed.