Greek and Roman Aesthetics

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Oleg V. Bychkov and Anne Sheppard (eds., trs.), Greek and Roman Aesthetics, Cambridge University Press, xlii + 249pp., $30.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521547925.

Reviewed by James I. Porter, University of California, Irvine


Aesthetic history and theory are on the rise again in classical studies. They were once a staple of the discipline, in good part thanks to the impetus of Kant and Hegel, and they flourished as a going concern throughout the latter half of the nineteenth century and into the middle of the twentieth century. Aesthetics during these salad days was respectable. It was philosophically informed. And you could count on anyone working in any branch of classical art or literature to know something about Winckelmann's theory of beauty, Lessing's championing of the word over the image, Goethe's theory of form, Kant's theory of taste, Schiller's view of the naïve, the Schlegels' notions of literary evolution, or Hegel's symbolic art. More to the point, discussions could be guided by questions of form, matter, content, expression, signification, sublimity, sensation, judgment, abstraction, value, and other high-level concepts. And once they reached this level, inquiries could be meshed, passing seamlessly from one medium to another: literary problems could be dealt with in the same breath as sculptural problems, or problems of coloration, or architectural form, and they could be approached with one and the same conceptual apparatus.

Barriers between the arts were sometimes erected in the tradition of philosophical aesthetics (Lessing is the most famous case), but usually they were not. But even when they were, comparisons were the norm, so comprehensive was the aesthetic perspective felt to be. Philosophical aesthetics conceives of aesthetic problems that transcend, but also encompass, the accidents of art as a phenomenon. They deal with universals that permit discussion of these differentiae, but in a way that brings out fundamental underlying frameworks. So conceived, aesthetics is a natural fit for the phenomena it describes. Art, after all, does not appear on different registers seriatim, but (for the most part) on all registers simultaneously. It doesn't appeal to the department of visual studies and the department of music and the department of philology and the department of the imagination, but to the university as a whole. All these aesthetically informed studies of the past benefitted from this advantage of their perspective on art, and from one more: they did not disparage the ancients' capacity for aesthetic reflection, and they often sought to discover forerunners in antiquity to their own perspectives on art.

This was the great, principally German, tradition of art historical and literary historical criticism, underpinned by a broad reading in aesthetic philosophy. Nietzsche, Riegl, Strzygowski, Warburg, Panofsky, and Wind are among the luminaries in this succession of writers. The continental Europeans cultivated their own aesthetically informed traditions in the wake of Croce in Italy and Merleau-Ponty in France, and the British did their part as well thanks to the likes of Bullough, Collingwood, Bell, and others. In the USA, there was Dewey, Beardsley, and Greenberg, though these made less of an impact in classics than any of the other previously named figures, just as aesthetic pursuits tended to be a proprietary Continental affair, not an Anglo-American one. The Eastern Europeans made few inroads much later, though not in classics. Then, ever so slowly, for no single or good reason, aesthetically oriented studies in classics began to fade after around 1950. Perhaps it was the disfavor into which the Germans, always at the vanguard of the discipline, had fallen after the War. Perhaps it was a tradition that had exhausted itself on its own. Possibly, too, it was killed off by the highly influential essay on the so-called "modern system of the arts" by Kristeller (1951-52), the expatriated German based at the time in New York, since in this essay Kristeller made popular an argument that had been floated in prior literature but never in English and never so boldly, claiming that the very idea of art, amenable to aesthetic inquiry, speculation, and philosophy, was an invention of the Enlightenment era. Hadn't Baumgarten, after all, coined the term aesthetics? If this was right, then applying such concepts as aesthetics and even art (in the sense of fine art) to the worlds of art before 1750 was tantamount to anachronism, and "Greek and Roman aesthetics" was nothing more than a contradiction in terms.

Luckily, not everyone believed Kristeller or his somewhat mindless philological argument (the logic of which ran: if the word doesn't exist, then the concept it names can't exist), least of all within classics where the term aesthetics could nonetheless live on, if not as abundantly as before then at least occasionally, and if not as a noun then at least in its adjectival forms. Interest in art and matters pertaining to what used to be called aesthetics continued to be pursued from Homer to the Byzantine era. What was missing were three, rather key ingredients: (i) the rich conceptual apparatus of the modern philosophical discourse on art and aesthetics from, say, Hutcheson to the present; (ii) attempts to connect this discourse up with ancient expressions, or pre-forms, of the same; and (iii) efforts to map out the practical implications within ancient art of these higher forms of reflection on the meaning and possibility of art -- or, more provocatively, the reverse influences, which is to say, the ways in which "folk" epistemologies as well as many of the earlier writers, poets, and thinkers paved the way for and nourished these higher-order reflections. And without these, aesthetics was living more or less an underground life, in the form of new criticism, description, appreciation, individual forays here and there, ad hoc inquiries, and so on, but generally following disciplinary divides and incapable of tackling big picture problems.

But why this reserve? Pace Kristeller and others, it is hard to deny that Aristotle is "doing" aesthetics in his Poetics when he defines poetics (hē poētikē) as the art of making most broadly conceived and when he defines reflection on poetics as being concerned with "the what," the "in what," and "the how," which is to say, the objects, medium, and methods of art (ch. 1). With poetics so defined, it is ready to take on all conceivable forms of human artifice, and above all those specifically concerned with the representation of thought or reality. The same could be said of a vast number of other ancient writers, from before Socrates to Plotinus and beyond, all of whom were engaged in reflection on aesthetics. What is odd is that no one, until now, has thought of putting a collection of such authors together in excerpted form so that students in the classroom (and those of their teachers who still need to be convinced) might see how significant the ancient aesthetic traditions were. With this book edited by Oleg Bychkov and Anne Sheppard, bearing the simple title Greek and Roman Aesthetics, this possibility is now on the way to becoming a reality.

The timing could not be any better. At this moment, the winds are shifting in classics. The past year has seen the release of a handful of new titles in the field of ancient aesthetics, and the next few years will see several more: The Art of Art History in Greco-Roman Antiquity (ed. Platt and Squire, 2010); Aesthetic Revelation: Reading Ancient and Medieval Texts after Hans Urs von Balthasar (Bychkov, 2010); The Origins of Aesthetic Thought in Ancient Greece: Matter, Sensation, and Experience (Porter, 2010); Frontiers of Pleasure: Models of Aesthetic Response in Archaic and Classical Thought (Peponi, forthcoming); A Companion to Ancient Aesthetics (ed. Destrée and Murray, forthcoming); Aesthetic Value in Classical Antiquity (ed. Rosen and Sluiter, forthcoming). These are all signs of serious endeavor among scholars. A companion volume is normally the sign of maturation in a field. Not so here, where it is more of an aspirational marker than anything else. And the same holds for the volume under review. The field of classics is witnessing a kind of resuscitation via defibrillation in the area of aesthetics. And the presence of a new reader of primary texts in translation is a most welcome sign.

The book itself is compact, covering a millennium of writings in some 240 pages, following, no doubt, the format requirements of the series in which it appears, "Cambridge Texts in the History of Philosophy." One can quibble all day long about what should have been included and what excluded, but all that really matters is whether the choices made are reasonable and representative, and whether they display any kind of logic or agenda. More on all this below. The texts, usefully annotated with textual or background information, are preceded by a brief Introduction on the history of aesthetics, primarily in antiquity, followed by a Chronology, Further Reading (not always current), and A Note on the Texts and the Translations, many of which were freshly undertaken for this volume, and all of which are superb. The two editors are specialists in late antique and Byzantine studies, so it is only to be expected that one of the distinguishing marks of this volume is that by the time you are half-way through the book you are well into the material from Republican Rome: later authors are better represented here than they are in, say, Russell and Winterbottom's much larger anthology, Ancient Literary Criticism (1988), which runs down to Aulus Gellius in the second century CE (and, as the title indicates, is primarily geared to a literary focus). These editors are not content with such a young date. They add three more centuries, pushing past Longinus to Augustine and eventually all the way forward to an anonymous Neoplatonic text dating from the sixth century CE and the end of the Academy. This expansion of the corpus into later antiquity is welcome. One might have gone further and included Byzantine texts (for instance, the essay on tragedy attributed to Michael Psellus; Psellus' essays on Euripides, the Greek novel, or music; or the brilliant preface by Eustathius to his commentary on the Iliad). It is a bit surprising not to find any Byzantine writings in this collection. A little less Plato or Cicero and more of this later material would have made for a fine trade. But beggars cannot be choosers.

Likewise in keeping with the expansionist agenda of this volume is the inclusion of writings across a broader spectrum of aesthetic areas than one is accustomed to see in anthologies of criticism: painting and sculpture (a selection from Xenophon's Memoirs; a selection from Philostratus' Life of Apollonius of Tyana; the preface to Philostratus' Pictures); music (a selection from Philodemus, On Music 4, based on Delattre's new edition of this work; a bit of Aristides Quintilianus, On Music; a selection of Augustine, On Music); morals (Cicero, Seneca, Augustine); religion (Cicero, Augustine); rhetoric and literary criticism (here underrepresented texts shine: Gorgias' Helen; Plato's Hippias Major and the Sophist; Philodemus, On Poems 5; a good selection from Cicero); and finally, a category unto itself: philosophical dabbling in aesthetics, usually from a metaphysical perspective (the divine demiurge in Plato's Timaeus; Plotinus' famous chapters on Beauty; Augustine's On Order, Confessions, and On the Trinity; the Neoplatonic commentaries on Plato by Proclus and the Anonymous author mentioned above).

This last inclusion really amounts to a strong and appealing argument, and the texts make it themselves beautifully, so to speak. It is that philosophers in antiquity (and not only there) were often in the first instance intensely engaged in aesthetic questions even when they least ought to have been, when their focus was directed elsewhere -- on cosmological problems, on the constitution of matter and form, on the nature of the human soul, or even (and perhaps especially) on the nature of the divine, in a word, whenever they were formulating ideas about deep and lasting value. At such moments, the dividing line between philosophy, metaphysics, theology, and aesthetics vanishes almost entirely. Often, all four areas can be seen to merge together (for instance, in Aristotle's account of god in the Metaphysics, not included here, though it would easily have fit in). And in such moments of indistinction, or rather of disciplinary confusion (as things appear from our modern perspective), the ancient world opens up and unfolds onto itself: here, Plotinus, say, leans heavily on all the earlier traditions of beauty, the sublime, of phenomenal and immaterial aesthetic experience, all writings in these areas that run from the first beginnings of Greek literature, from Homer in fact, down through Gorgias, Plato, Aristotle, and on into the third century. It takes all of this to arrive at such statements as these: "No eye ever saw the sun without becoming sun-like and no soul can see the beautiful without becoming beautiful. Let everyone first become godlike and beautiful, if he intends to look at God and beauty."

Gods are beautiful beings in Homer, in Greek lyric, in Plato, in Epicurus, and in Neoplatonism. They are also this in popular thought, which is perhaps one of the greatest weaknesses of the present anthology of texts: what it represents is unabashedly the high, learned, elite, and deeply skilled philosophical traditions of Greece and Rome. The present anthology runs, in essence, from Plato to … Plato. What it leaves out are the testaments of hoi polloi, the plebs, the craftsmen, the minority voices, the men and women on the street who also had aesthetic experiences and perceptions whenever they went to the market or the theater, or engaged in rituals, or arranged their houses and gardens. Evidence like this is undoubtedly harder to come by and probably harder to anthologize, but it does exist. Aristophanes and other representatives of Old, Middle, and Roman Comedy are important witnesses. Euripides is too. There are school papyri and lessons to be learned from the Attic orators or from Roman declamations. The Roman satirists and Ovid often bring us closer to ground-level than Plato and Aristotle do. Some scholastic literature by the grammarians and other guardians of texts can bring daily realities more vividly to life than high-flown philosophy (but is usually relegated to the realm of commentary or realia). Inscriptions contain a rich record of popular aesthetic perceptions, but they remain an underexploited resource. Polemical asides in mainstream literature can throw open a window onto another arena, that of the everyday, and remind us that the highest and most speculative forms of thought were always written against existing, often popular, conceptions. They can, accordingly, be used as a precious witness to these underrepresented currents.

The contemporary revival of aesthetics is a laudable project. But it is in danger of repeating the biases of its nineteenth-century avatars, who were enslaved to a classical ideal that in turn was mesmerized by Platonism and Aristotelianism. We should not make the same mistake again today. Instead of taking these former bastions as our guideposts, we should look to other, fresher models of aesthetic thought and experience, be this Dewey's Art as Experience, Merleau-Ponty's L'Oeil et l'esprit, Baxandall's several writings, Saito's Everyday Aesthetics, or our own instincts as these have been shaped by the various revolutions in art that have transformed modern sensibilities and tastes and liberated them from the straightjackets of the past. If we follow these worthy leads, we run only one risk: that we will rediscover the aesthetic potentials of antiquity in ways that we never before imagined.