Greek-Latin Philosophical Interaction: Collected Essays of Sten Ebbesen, Volume 1

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Sten Ebbesen, Greek-Latin Philosophical Interaction: Collected Essays of Sten Ebbesen, Volume 1, Ashgate, 2008, 230pp., $99.95 (hbk), ISBN 97807546583758.

Reviewed by Chris Schabel, University of Cyprus



I think I was asked to review this book by mistake. True, in the spring of 2008, here in Nicosia, Cyprus, my colleague Martin Hinterberger and I held a conference entitled “Greeks, Latins, and Intellectual History, 1204-1500.” Naturally, one of the invited speakers was Sten Ebbesen of the University of Copenhagen, not because he has been fluent in Modern Greek since studying at Thessaloniki in the late 60s during the Junta, but because few if any other people are in a position to comment intelligently on just about any topic that fits under the rubric of the conference title. It was a great pleasure to learn that Ashgate had performed the service of collecting and republishing many of Ebbesen’s studies on the subject of Greek-Latin philosophical interaction, as the first of three volumes of articles by the Danish scholar. Yet the focus of the first volume is more clearly described on page i: “[It] explores issues of relevance to the history of logic and semantics.” Now, I am certainly no logician. So what can the average medieval intellectual historian like me — or most of the readers of this review — gain from a book that concentrates on the “connections and/or differences between Greek and Latin theory and scholarly procedures, with special emphasis on late antiquity and the Middle Ages,” surrounding topics in logic and semantics?

The answer turns out to be “quite a bit,” so much, in fact, that my amateur’s perspective is probably more useful than that of a logic snob. The volume consists of fourteen papers, two of them entirely new, a third based on an earlier study, and the remaining eleven previously published (between 1981 and 2005) but with updated notes, minor corrections, and the removal of (almost all) typographical errors (the pagination of the originals is given in square brackets throughout). The table of contents is as follows:

1. The Greek under the Latin and the Latin under the Greek (new)

2. Greek-Latin Philosophical Interaction (originally published in 2002)

3. The Odyssey of Semantics from the Stoa to Buridan (1983)

4. The Chimera’s Diary — edited by Sten Ebbesen (1986)

5. Where were the Stoics in the Late Middle Ages? (2004)

6. Theories of Language in the Hellenistic Age and in the Twelfth and Thirteenth Centuries (2005)

7. Late-ancient Ancestors of Medieval Philosophical Commentaries (2003)

8. Boethius on Aristotle (new)

9. Boethius on the Metaphysics of Words (2003)

10. Western and Byzantine Approaches to Logic (1992)

11. Greek and Latin Medieval Logic (1996)

12. Philoponus, ‘Alexander’ and the Origins of Medieval Logic (1990)

13. Analysing Syllogisms of Anonymous Aurelianensis III — the (presumably) Earliest Extant Latin Commentary on the Prior Analytics and its Greek Model (1981)

14. Fragments of ’Alexander’s’ Commentaries on Analytica Posteriora and Sophistici Elenchi (new, based on article of 1990)

One of my favorites was not included: “George Pachymeres and the Topics” (1996), in which Ebbesen argues that Pachymeres’ work is not an original Greek treatise but a translation from Latin, an article that includes Ebbesen’s own re-translation of the Greek text into scholastic Latin! It is this linguistic expertise in Greek and Latin, classical and medieval, that has driven Ebbesen’s scholarly engines for four decades. In the new Chapter 1, “The Greek under the Latin and the Latin under the Greek”, Ebbesen introduces his work and explains its significance. Using his intimate knowledge of the languages, Ebbesen has read a mountain of ancient and medieval texts, published and still in manuscript, particularly on logical issues. The resulting publications inform us not only about the specifics (some of which will be presented in the other two volumes), but also about the general intellectual history of both East and West from late antiquity to the fall of Constantinople, and about the ways in which East and West influenced each other along the way. Ebbesen provides more background information in Chapter 12: “[I]n my early twenties, I embarked on a one-man crusade to rescue the glorious achievements of Byzantine logicians from the oblivion into which they had fallen” (p. 157). It turned out, however, that his research confirmed definitively that medieval Greek logic was of little note and even late-antique Greek logicians would not have measured up to “mediocre Parisian masters” (p. 158) of the later medieval period. Collectively the volume’s papers flesh out this skeletal tale in an original way, but there is also considerable attention devoted to the Stoic heritage in logic and semantics and to the achievement and influence of Boethius as commentator.

Chapter 2 traces the waves of Greek impact on Latin philosophy: the first century BC (Cicero, e.g.), 350-525 AD (to the death of Boethius), late 10th-early 12th centuries (to Abelard), mid-12th-early 14th centuries, and the quattrocento, which in part resulted from the 13th-century Latin version of the Elementatio Theologica of Proclus. This work “acted as a virus in the body of Latin scholasticism, which slowly began to crave for more Platonism.” The Greek effect on the Latin was in certain respects cumulative, and by the 12th century the West was the innovator and had surpassed the Greek world. It took a long time for the Greeks to notice this, but the new Latin learning did influence first Greek theology and then philosophy in the 14th and 15th centuries, although by then most Greek learning — and many intellectuals — had gone West.

Chapter 10 goes over the same chronological ground but focuses on logic, comparing East and West in terms of numbers, genres, practitioners, and institutions, with the East supporting the educated rhetorician and the West the specialist. Ebbesen concludes by remarking on the irony that the Renaissance in the West began to appreciate “the Byzantine-educated man more than the specialist who knew the difference between ‘any man’s donkey is running’ and ‘the donkey of any man is running’.” This sentiment is echoed at the start of Chapter 5 when Ebbesen describes the peak of scholasticism:

“centuries that produced a considerable number of tough men ready to chew their way through all the tedious logic stuff that disgusts a gentleman, and make all the nice distinctions necessary to work out a coherent, and perhaps even consistent, picture of the structure of the world.”

Chapter 11 expands on chapter 10, especially on the genres of Greek and Latin logical writings. By the later Middle Ages comparing East and West is difficult: the West was expanding and the East was shrinking, and while the West entered the University era — where theologians trained in logic could display their skills in Sentences commentaries — the East remained more or less on the level of the earlier cathedral school. Chapter 7 also treats the genre issue, bringing out the similarities and differences between early Greek and later Latin works and noting Boethius’ importance as a mediator. Chapters 8 and 9 break new ground in the study of Boethius himself, trying to get at his sources, notably Porphyry, and his overall world view based on his incomplete publishing program.

Other chapters follow more specific threads in this general fabric. Chapters 3 and 4 deal with thorny questions of language and ontology and the relationship between the two over time, with the Stoics playing a role. Chapter 5 more particularly investigates the remnants of Stoicism in late-medieval thought — not just logic — and how they came to be there when Stoic texts were not. Chapter 6, on theories of language, also touches on the Stoic impact, as do several other papers, such as Chapter 12, which is also one of the many papers offering important insights into the spectrum of realist-nominalist positions over time. Indeed, this volume will be of great interest to students of the history of metaphysics.

I had read several of the papers before over the past fifteen years or so, but sporadically. Reading those again along with the others “all in one go,” however, I was struck by how true page i’s analysis is: “[Ebbesen’s] style is crisp and lucid and his philosophical penetration and exposition of often difficult concepts and issues is both clear and intellectually impressive.” What the author of this quotation was perhaps ashamed to say is that Ebbesen’s style is just plain fun, often hilarious, an excellent didactic tool for those of us who might otherwise suffer from temporary A.D.D.

Take Chapter 4: “The Chimera’s Diary — edited by Sten Ebbesen.” For Logic and Being, edited by fellow Nordic historians of philosophy Simo Knuuttila and Jaako Hintikka, Ebbesen decided to survey the history of a topic in logic, semantics, and ontology by presenting the autobiography of an “experimental animal,” a chimera that describes how he/she/it has been used by philosophers. Although strictly speaking Ebbesen is not the author of this piece, but only the editor, nevertheless its inclusion here is fair game, because elsewhere in the volume Ebbesen prints material from other authors, albeit in Latin and Greek. The chimera traces its ontological status from Homeric times down to Jean Buridan, in whose thought the poor chimera has only “a word and a corresponding complex concept, but not a trace of old-fashioned being.” In desperation the chimera writes its diary at this point, trying at least to retain some existence in human memory. Likewise, Chapter 11 begins with a first person plural statement from Greeks and Latins describing the situation in logic around 500 AD. Most chapters, in fact, are replete with interesting metaphors, entertaining examples from the likes of Winnie the Pooh and William of Baskerville, and humor. Only the last two chapters, “Analysing Syllogisms of Anonymous Aurelianensis III” and “Fragments of ’Alexander’s’ Commentaries”, make for slow going for the non-logician, who might want to concentrate on the introductions and conclusions.

Sten Ebbesen has always been generous with his help and advice. In Chapter 2, the title of which is the same as the book’s, he refers to early Latin scholastics’ awareness that they sat on the shoulders of giants, remarking how this entailed that they could see further. The philological, philosophical, palaeographical, and historical erudition required to make progress on the topic of Greek-Latin philosophical interaction means that, by collecting the main fruits of Ebbesen’s labors so far, Ashgate has done a great service for the brave souls who in the future will continue his work, sitting on his shoulders.

Being a devoted medievalist, Sten Ebbesen follows a Trinitarian model in his main publications. The present volume is the Pater of Ebbesen’s second Trinitas, a triad representing the second phase of his scholarly career. The first trinity, from the first phase of his academic life, was his monumental three-volume Commentators and Commentaries on Aristotle’s Sophistici Elenchi, which included editions of both Greek and Latin texts. As he enters his final, apostolic age of fruitful research, what will be the subject of his third trinity of volumes on the history of philosophy?