Groove: A Phenomenology of Rhythmic Nuance

Placeholder book cover

Tiger C. Roholt, Groove: A Phenomenology of Rhythmic Nuance, Bloomsbury, 2014, 175pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781441104182.

Reviewed by Clément Canonne, University of Burgundy


This book is a welcome addition to the ever-growing field of the philosophy of music. It tackles with a lot of clarity an overlooked subject -- the phenomenon of groove -- which is crucial in the appreciation of a great number of popular music genres (e.g., jazz, reggae, funk, rhythm and blues, hip-hop). Groove is this "quality of music that makes people tap their feet, rock their head and get up and dance" (Madison 2006, p. 201). While a central phenomenon for listeners, dancers and, of course, musicians themselves -- which Tiger Roholt shows with an illuminating example from the Beatles' Love Me Do recording session -- it remains very mysterious, as testified by the difficulty we seem to have in defining the very concept of groove. Yet we all have a clear sense of how groove music make us feel when listening to tunes such as Herbie Hancock's Hang Up Your Hang Ups or James Brown's Cold Sweat. In this book, Roholt's endeavor is to clarify the feel that arises in the musical experience of a groove, by answering two major questions:

1)    What exactly do we hear when we hear a groove?

2)    What is the role of the body and bodily movements in such an experience?

In chapter 1, Roholt introduces the question of musical nuances -- all those tiny (and sometimes not so tiny) deviations in pitch or duration made by musicians when performing. According to Roholt, groove is largely a matter of micro-timing nuances. Micro-timing nuances explain why two parts identical in their rhythmic notation can actually sound very differently.In the present case, it can explain why one part grooves while the other does not, or why one part achieves the right kind of groove while the other does not. A general problem is that such musical nuances are said to be ineffable (Raffman 1993), our capacity for pitch or duration discrimination being far more precise than our music-theoretical concepts (C-sharp, eighth-note, and so on). Roholt addresses this problem by claiming that musical nuances may not be effable, but their objectives -- the fact that a musician performs a musical nuance for a reason (such as: "I want to brighten my sound here" or "I want to play this phrase with an elastic feel") -- clearly are. Indeed, we can discuss these nuance objectives not only by indirect descriptions -- trying to render these nuance objectives by carefully describing the perceptual experience that they elicit -- but also by referring to recording or performance examples that are shared in a given culture or community. This should not be seen as an escape strategy from the ineffability problems, as the musicians are themselves much more concerned with what the micro-timing variations accomplish -- eliciting the right sort of groove -- than they are concerned with the micro-timing nuances themselves.

In chapter 2, Roholt tries to identify the listening attitudes that can induce the listener to have a groove experience. The bulk of the discussion rests on the opposition between "analytical" perception and what he calls "engaged" perception. Roholt claims that analytically focusing on the performance's micro-timing nuances (the point of view endorsed in the empirical studies done by pianist-researcher Vijay Iyer, discussed at length by Roholt) modifies our ordinary perception and disrupts the experience of groove, for at least three reasons. First, grooves are gestalts, holistic experiences that depend on the perception of the music as a whole; their sense thus depends on their role in the whole. Second, some nuances can only play their role when they operate in the background of perception, and not in the role of figure. Roholt draws on an example discussed by Merleau-Ponty. Painters usually add reflections in the eyes that enliven the face of a portrait. But this detail must stay in the background of perception in order to function properly: as soon as we focus on it, the "gestalt of enlivening" disappears. Like the reflections that direct our gaze towards the perception of a certain gestalt, micro-timing nuances need to stay in the background in order to mediate our perception of the music, guide our hearing towards the interlocking rhythmic patterns or the temporal tensions between two lines, and foster the feeling of groove. Third, some perceptions need to remain indeterminate or ambiguous in order to produce their effects. Roholt draws here on the Müller-Lyer illusion. The peculiar feeling we have when seeing the Müller-Lyer lines is due to the ambiguity of our perception -- we effectively perceive the lines to be neither of the same lengths nor of different lengths. This feeling disappears as soon as we try to clarify our perception, for example by making the effort to confirm that the lines are actually of the same length. In a similar way, by allowing the micro-timing nuances to remain indeterminate or ambiguous, we perceive the musical parts both as rhythmically tight (far from the ample rubato that can be used by classical musicians) and as elastic/pushing/pulling/leaning, etc. This ambiguity plays a crucial role in the groove feeling.

According to Roholt, this groove-inducing listening attitude is not so much a matter of propositional knowledge (knowing certain facts about grooves) as a matter of procedural knowledge (a practical know-how, tagged as a "facility for groove" by Roholt) involving the body and actual bodily movements. Roholt  dedicates the last two chapters (3 and 4) to clarifying the role of the body in this "facility for groove" listeners seem to possess, using Merleau-Ponty's concept of motor-intentionality (see Merleau-Ponty 2012). Perceiving a groove involves the body in a strong way: our body is not only moved by the music, but also actively directed towards the music. This feeling that arises from the motor-intentional movements directed towards music -- the dynamical bodily exploration of music -- precisely is the feel of a groove. As such, groove is not only a quality of the experience we have when we listen to groove music, but also a direct result of the activity of our bodies. According to Roholt, "getting" a groove involves exploring the temporal tensions of the music through one's body:

through movement to the pulse, I set up expectations of rhythmic regularity in my body. Timing nuances thwart that regularity, and these tensions are felt more profoundly than many other perceptual qualities because they are felt in and by the body as a bodily disequilibrium. (p. 112)

That bodily feel is thus more than a form of embodied knowledge, which conveys something to us about the localization of our body in musical time: it is also the central aspect of the aesthetic appreciation of groove music.

The book concludes with a few considerations on the ontology of music. If grooves -- and other musical nuances -- are such an important part of our musical experience, how does this reflect on our ontology of musical works? Are the groove-inducing effects (and other expressive/somatic effects music can produce) part of the performance's properties or constitutive properties of the musical work itself? In the case of classical music, where musical works are generally thought of as abstract types (Dodd 2007), Roholt argues that nuance types could be constitutive properties of the works, along with pitch classes, relative durations, instrumental timbres, etc. To my mind, this is just another way to say that performing practices in which the composition takes place are part of the identity of the works themselves (see Davies 2001); indeed, these performance practices typically establish rules and norms in the use of musical nuances (e.g., rubato, intonation, articulation) by the performers. In the case of popular music, where musical works are generally considered to be the recordings themselves (Gracyk 1996), Roholt argues that our ontology should include not only musical nuances (which are preserved by the recording technology) but also the effects of such nuances. This leads him to suggest an idealist ontology, inspired by Roman Ingarden's view of literary works, where musical works are intentional objects, requiring a certain kind of active perception from the listener to exist in their complete, non-schematic form. This view is certainly interesting, but its presentation here is too sketchy to be anything else than programmatic. It would need much more careful argumentation in order to overcome the traditional objections that can be made against this kind of position, for example, that such a view does not allow us to distinguish between the work and the subjective experience one has of the work, or that it transforms an object which is intrinsically public, with a certain number of objective properties, into something private and, at least partially, non-shareable. (For other objections that can be made against idealism in music ontology, see Levinson 2000).

With its many thoroughly discussed examples, Roholt's account of groove is very engaging, and I find much to agree with. Merleau-Ponty's concept of motor-intentionality is indeed a stimulating one, and can certainly help us to understand the fundamental role played by the body in any musical experience, beyond the single case of groove music. As Roholt rightly puts it, the relation between the music and our bodies is not unidirectional. Sure, our body moves to the music, and music elicits a wide range of corporeal responses, from exuberant dancing to slight moves of the hands or fingers. But it is also important to stress that music's meaning -- for example its emotional content -- is also at least partially constructed through our body, and that the understanding of music requires a bodily exploration of the numerous movements of tension and relaxation -- be they melodic, harmonic or rhythmic -- that are at the center of the vast majority of the music in the world.

The one major regret I have is that throughout his book Roholt seems to entertain a slightly caricatural vision of empirical and analytical research on groove. If some studies on expressiveness indeed ask their subjects to focus on micro-timing nuances, in order to measure their level of precision in the detection of such musical nuances (see Clarke 1989), the majority of empirical studies dedicated to the phenomenon of groove are rather concerned with determining the musical features that can induce for the listener the groove feeling, by typically asking listeners to rate this feeling while listening to different musical samples (see Ashley 2014 for a recent literature review). There is no reason to assume that such studies are driven by an underlying operationalism, where the very concept of groove would be defined by a certain number of acoustical parameters. It is rather a matter of finding the acoustical and musical foundations that allow the experience of groove to emerge -- the set of acoustical and musical properties on which the phenomenon of groove supervenes, to put it otherwise, as it should be clear to everyone that only certain kinds of music are able to induce a groove experience. As I see it, the phenomenological approach championed by Roholt, aiming at clarifying what really constitutes the groove experience, is thus fully compatible with the approaches of empirical musicologists or psychologists, which aim at clarifying the acoustical and musical conditions allowing for such an experience.

In this regard, it is surprising that Roholt makes so much of micro-timing nuances to explain the groove phenomenon while empirical research tends to show that such nuances only play a marginal role (if any) in the groove feeling. For example, recent studies showed that

two main factors (beat salience and event density) explained most of the feeling of the groove as rated by the listeners, regardless of excerpt genre. Notably, micro-timing had little effect, suggesting that the "feel" typically attributed to small variations in timing or voice asynchrony may be unimportant for grooves. (Ashley 2014, p. 158; see also Madison and Sioros 2014)

Other factors seem much more important to groove than micro-timing nuances: repetition (groove is often built through repetition, and that may explain why classical music, with its emphasis on development or variation rather than on immediate repetition, is not often groove-inducing); a medium-fast tempo; rhythmical and metrical tensions (achieved through syncopation, a high density of notes in the faster metrical levels, or the interlocking rhythmical patterns typical of funk music); and a strongly felt downbeat (on the first beat of each measure).

But these few reservations do not diminish the great pleasure I had reading this book, which opens very fertile directions for the articulation and elaboration of a truly embodied aesthetics of music, and which should encourage philosophers of music to put the body back on the agenda in no uncertain terms.


ASHLEY, Richard (2014). "Expressiveness in Funk" in D. FABIAN, R. TIMMERS and E. SCHUBERT, Expressiveness in Music Performance, Oxford, Oxford University Press, pp. 154-169.

CLARKE, Eric (1989). "The Perception of Expressive Timing in Music", Psychological Research, 51, pp. 2-9.

DAVIES, Stephen (2001). Musical Works and Performances, Oxford, Oxford University Press.

DODD, Julian (2007). Works of Music: An Essay in Ontology, Oxford, Oxford University Press.

GRACYK, Theodore (1996). Rhythm and Noise: An Aesthetics of Rock, Durham, Duke University Press.

LEVINSON, Jerrold (2000). "Review of Roger Scruton, The Aesthetics of Music", The Philosophical Review, 109/4, pp. 608-614

MADISON, Guy (2006). "Experiencing Groove Induced by Music Consistency and Phenomenology", Music Perception, 24/2, pp. 201-208.

MADISON, Guy and SIOROS, George (2014). "What Musicians Do To Induce the Sensation of Groove in Simple and Complex Melodies, and How Listeners Perceive It", Frontiers in Psychology, 5/894, doi:10.3389/fpsyg.2014.00894.

MERLEAU-PONTY, Maurice (2012). Phenomenology of Perception, New-York, Routledge.

RAFFMAN, Diana (1993). Language, Music and Mind, Cambridge, MIT Press.