Groundwork for the Metaphysics of Morals

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Christoph Horn and Dieter Schönecker (eds.), Groundwork for the Metaphysics of Morals, Walter de Gruyter, 2006, 343pp., $44.00 (pbk), ISBN 9783110177077.

Reviewed by Andrews Reath, University of California, Riverside


This collection of thirteen essays is a cooperative commentary on Kant's Groundwork by a group of Kant scholars (Germans, Americans and one Swede) including both established and younger scholars.[1] An essay is devoted to each important stretch of text (except, oddly, the discussion of autonomy in the last third of Groundwork II). Reading through the collection takes one through the overall trajectory of the Groundwork. Each author takes seriously the task of addressing the main issues raised by his or her assigned portion of the Groundwork, with most focusing on close reading and others choosing to pursue the philosophical questions raised by the text. All of the essays make interesting or thought-provoking points about the text, some more persuasively than others. Several are important essays that deserve more critical discussion than can be provided here. Given space limitations, I must be selective in describing the main themes of the essays.

Nico Scarano's essay on the Preface of the Groundwork is concerned mainly with why Kant thinks that a "metaphysics of morals" is indispensable for moral understanding (though it closes with some interesting remarks on Kant's description of his methodology at the close of the Preface). To understand the indispensability of a metaphysics of morals, we need to understand the kind of necessity that moral requirements have. Scarano argues that it is the modal necessity of modern logic -- that a moral requirement holds in all possible worlds -- rather than a distinctive normative brand of necessity. (7-11) He then explains the indispensability of a metaphysics of morals through "the central argument" that he finds in ¶7 of the Preface (G 4: 389), an argument from this notion of necessity to the conclusion that moral principles are knowable a priori. (12-15) This seems to me to read a lot into ¶7, and I find it more plausible to understand the necessity of moral requirements as distinctively normative.

In "The Good Without Limitation", Allen Wood tries to clear up what he regards as misunderstandings (even among sympathetic readers) of the opening thesis of Groundwork I that a good will is "good without limitation". (G 4: 393-4) The essay makes several interpretive claims that are original and worth considering. For Wood, the thesis that a good will is good without limitation is a narrow thesis about the value of a good will that does not rule out comparative judgments about instances of other goods and combinations of goods. For example, this thesis is consistent with holding that "the complex of a good will plus the good results at which it aims is a better whole" than that of the same good will and some bad results that it was unable to prevent. (30) In this respect the value of a good will is "not foundational for Kant's ethics" (41) -- those values are, e.g., the autonomy of reason and the dignity of rational nature (31) -- but part of a strategy for deriving certain claims about the principle of morality. One of Wood's more striking claims is that an agent need not act from duty (that is, from self-constraint to do what is right) in order to have a good will. The quality of one's will depends on the objective content of one's maxim, independently of one's incentive for adopting it. So one has a good will if one acts from a good principle -- dealing honestly with one's customers, helping another in need -- whether moved to adopt the principle by prudence or duty, natural inclination or respect. (33-35) This is an attractive thesis in many ways, though it seems hard to square with Kant's claim that only actions done from respect have moral worth.

Christoph Horn tackles the puzzling interlude in Groundwork I where Kant appeals to teleological considerations to confirm the idea that the vocation of practical reason is to produce a good will rather than to direct the pursuit of happiness. (G 4: 394-6) He identifies the audience of these paragraphs: they are directed against both the Stoics and modern "a-theological naturalists" who in different ways hold that reason is to be used solely to pursue happiness. (52-54) He also usefully locates these paragraphs in the context of Kant's considered views about teleology in works such as Idea for a Universal History and the Critique of Judgment.

Marcia Baron's essay, "Acting from Duty", clarifies why Kant's examples in Groundwork I (G 4: 397-401) contrast actions to which one is immediately inclined with actions done from duty in the absence of inclination. It is not because we should be in the business of judging motives; nor is it because one cannot act from duty if one is immediately inclined toward the action. Rather, without a clear understanding of the difference between acting from duty and acting from inclination, we misunderstand the principle that guides a good will. (77, 89)

Many commentators have argued that there is a serious gap in Kant's two derivations of the FUL (Formula of Universal Law), in Groundwork I from an analysis of respect for the moral law (G 4: 402) and in Groundwork II from the concept of a categorical imperative. (G 4: 420ff.) Harald Köhl defends Kant's arguments. The issue here is whether Kant succeeds in making a transition from what Köhl characterizes as a weaker to a stronger notion of lawfulness. The weaker ("lawfulness1") is the demand that action conform to some universal law, and the stronger ("lawfulness2") is the demand expressed by FUL that a maxim be "universalizable and can thus justifiably be demanded of all addressees." (96) Through a close interpretation of the relevant texts, Köhl tries to show how Kant succeeds in making this transition, and argues that well-known criticisms (e.g., of Aune, Wood, and Allison) are based on misreadings.

Marcus Willaschek's contribution does a very nice job of unpacking the conception of practical reason presented in the important section G 4: 412-7, giving a careful presentation of Kant's notions of practical reason, the will, and the necessitation expressed by an imperative. It also includes an interesting discussion of the notion of a holy will, suggesting that such a will could have inclinations as long as they necessarily align with laws of reason. (131) Bernd Ludwig's essay makes several technical points about hypothetical imperatives. For example, the distinction between hypothetical and categorical imperatives cannot be captured by grammatical or logical form, but rather marks a distinction between the way in which imperatives command. On his reading of the analytic character of the means-end formula, someone who knows that M is a means to his (purported) end E and does not want M, does not want (but only wishes) E. (If the agent wants E, he necessarily wants M.) A hypothetical imperative, then, does not necessitate by making an action necessary; rather it makes a decision necessary when one is faced with certain conflicting wishes -- either give up the (wish for the?) end or use the means. (148) Ludwig works out this approach in detail, but it does not seem to me to leave sufficient room for irrational conduct that violates the instrumental principle.

In "The Categorical Imperative and Universalizability", Mark Timmons assesses the adequacy of the principle of universalizability associated with Kant's FUL and FLN (Formula of the Law of Nature). This is a useful and important essay that provides an overview of the different approaches and problems to be addressed, while offering some new thoughts on the issues. Timmons treats the FLN as a "decision procedure" for moral deliberation -- a principle for making assessments of right and wrong -- rather than a "moral criterion" specifying the properties that make an action right. (That function is assigned to the FH [Formula of Humanity].) He identifies the "core assumptions" on which its adequacy as a moral decision procedure depends (that it be self-sufficient and yield intuitively plausible verdicts that are properly related to right- and wrong-making features of actions), as well as additional assumptions that make for a "stronger model" (e.g., that it sort perfect from imperfect duties, yield verdicts about a range of specific actions, etc.). Many sympathetic interpreters have thought that while a strong model cannot be defended, the core assumptions can. Timmons argues that even the core assumptions do not hold up. Here he makes the interesting point that the FH is the basis of a "theory of moral relevance" (an account of the morally relevant features of actions that maxims must include); but for that reason FLN is not a self-sufficient procedure from which moral principles can be derived. (Here one might ask whether self-sufficiency need be a "core assumption".) However, though FUL/FLN is not a viable decision procedure, all is not lost. It still articulates a set of formal constraints on what substantive considerations count as moral reasons. While not sufficient by itself to generate substantive moral conclusions, it can be employed ad hominem to get agents to acknowledge moral considerations that they already accept. This essay deserves further discussion.

Samuel Kerstein discusses Kant's derivation of the FH. Korsgaard and Wood have argued that Kant mounts a "regressive argument" for the claim that humanity is an end in itself that begins from the assumption that when a rational agent sets an end, he takes it to be objectively good. Kerstein argues that, as interesting as this argument may be, it is not found in the Groundwork. Instead Kant (at G 4: 428-9) employs an argument by elimination that surveys possible candidates for an end of absolute value and eliminates all but humanity. Kerstein finds this argument weak, but suggests that it can be strengthened by appealing to the absolute value of a good will.

Klaus Steigleder addresses Kant's analytic argument that a freewill is subject to the moral law. (G 4: 446-7) While most interpretations of this argument connect free agency with the FUL, Steigleder appears to connect free agency with the considerations that underlie the FH. What is central to pure practical reason is the capacity to follow necessary rational ends and any agent with pure practical reason must understand himself to be an end in itself. (227-8, 231, 237) In situating the argument of Groundwork III relative to Groundwork II, Steigleder suggests an argument from the concept of an unconditional moral ought to necessary rational ends, and from there to the value of rational nature as an end in itself. (227-8) Likewise, the analytic argument from freedom to morality goes through the capacity to follow necessary ends of reason. Both reconstructions are suggestive, though I don't find them fully developed.

Corinna Mieth and Jacob Rosenthal contribute a good essay on Kant's claim that "Freedom must be presupposed as a property of the will of all rational beings." (G 4: 447-8) They give a good reconstruction of Kant's argument (presenting it as a "practical argument" beginning from presuppositions of the first person perspective of rational deliberation, theoretical or practical), followed by an extended critical discussion of various philosophical issues that draws on Kant's other treatments of free agency. Mieth and Rosenthal distinguish five notions of freedom that appear in Groundwork III: "freedom as rationality" (the capacity to guide deliberation by rational principles), "negative freedom" (freedom from determination by natural laws), "freedom as spontaneity" (the capacity to initiate new causal chains), "freedom as autonomy" (the capacity to act from self-given laws), and "freedom as indeterminism" (freedom from all causal determinism needed for alternative possibilities at the time of action). (257) They argue (rightly in my view) that Kant's claims about the necessity of acting under the idea of freedom establish the existence only of "freedom as rationality." (259-60, 267ff.) They provide a good account of why the fact that we must regard ourselves as free in this sense licenses the assertion that we are free in this sense. (266-7) Kant thought that the second through fourth notions of freedom follow from the first, but Mieth and Jacob Rosenthal give reasons to doubt this. For example, in their view "negative freedom" does not follow, since following laws of reason does not exclude being determined by causal laws. (272-276) Readers immersed in these questions will certainly take issue with some of Mieth and Rosenthal's claims, but overall it is a good analytical paper that points to several important questions.

Kant notoriously worries that there may be a circle in his initial argument from rationality and freedom to morality. (G 4: 450) Marcel Quarfood tries to explain Kant's worry about the appearance of a circle, analyzing its logical structure as a petitio principii, where freedom is assumed only because it leads to the desired conclusion, that of the authority of morality. Quarfood astutely observes that if the suspicion of a circle is removed by introducing the two standpoints of transcendental idealism, lack of explicit mention of this doctrine must be what occasions Kant's worries. (296) Introducing the two standpoints provides grounds for ascribing freedom to ourselves that is independent of our interest in confirming the authority of morality, by pointing to the spontaneity of reason.

Dieter Schönecker's essay, "How is a Categorical Imperative Possible?" (based on his 1999 book) provides many insights into Kant's attempted "deduction" of the categorical imperative in Groundwork III. This is an important interpretive essay. Schönecker argues that in order to make sense of the structure of Groundwork III and to locate the "deduction" where Kant says that it occurs (at G 4: 453-4), the analytic connection between freedom and morality must be interpreted as follows: it is analytic both that a perfectly rational being follows the moral law and that the pure will of a sensibly affected rational being follows the moral law. On this reading, the authority of moral obligation does not follow analytically once one establishes that human beings must understand themselves as members of the intelligible world, thus as having a free, or pure, will. Rather, the deduction must provide a reason why agents belonging to both the intelligible and sensible worlds should follow the law of their pure will, rather than desire-based incentives. The key to this argument is what Schönecker calls "the ontoethical principle": simplifying, since the intelligible world is the ground of the sensible world, the intelligible self is the authentic self and the law of the pure will is properly authoritative. According to Schönecker, the force of the argument depends on the "ontic superiority" of the intelligible world and of the "authentic [eigentliche] self" (316-7) -- a principle that he finds philosophically dubious. Schönecker's reading has the virtue of assigning real argumentative work to Kant's remark that the intelligible world is ground of the sensible world and his remarks about the "authentic self". His rejection of the principle of the ontic superiority of the intelligible is well-taken. But for just that reason, one might question whether his is the best reading of these remarks of Kant's.

Overall this is an important collection. I highly recommend it to scholars and students of Kant's ethics, or to philosophers seeking insights about specific portions of the Groundwork.

[1] Citations to the Groundwork are by volume and page number in the Berlin Academy edition. I'll use standard abbreviations to refer to the formulas of the categorical imperative: FUL for the Formula of Universal Law, FLN for the Formula of the Law of Nature, and FH for the Formula of Humanity.