Habermas and Literary Rationality

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David L. Colclasure, Habermas and Literary Rationality, Routledge, 2010, 124pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415994712.

Reviewed by Johanna Meehan, Grinnell College


In one of his earliest works Habermas maintained that literature and the salons in which it was discussed played an important role in the rise of the public sphere. But, as David Colclasure argues, over time, Habermas has tended to relegate literature to a much less politically important role. He has come, Colclasure argues, to describe "aesthetic practice and aesthetic criticism in the modern age as concerned primarily with the genuineness of subjective self-representations."  Colclasure examines why this is so, pointing out that, despite his "official" minimization of the political importance of literature, in actual practice -- especially clear in Habermas' lively discussions with Christa Wolf and other literary figures on the eve of German reunification in the 1990s -- Habermas demonstrates his continued intuitive recognition of the political importance of literature. Indeed, Colclasure argues, Habermas' engagement with Wolff and other German writers offers an "account of the role of the literary public sphere [that] can be read out of but against the grain of his theoretical work." (p. 3)

This would be an important accomplishment, Colclasure argues, because literature is not merely a vehicle of self-expression, as Haberamas has "officially" claimed, but also an important site for the contestation of validity claims of all sorts. It is, further, vital for the healthy functioning of the public sphere as a whole. Colclasure contests the role that Habermas' communicative theory of action ascribes to literature on two grounds. First, he claims, when literature and other aesthetic works are viewed as mere expressions of subjectivity, their political importance as vehicles for the discussion and contestation of norms is not recognized. Second, when the normative work of literature is not recognized, its importance for the proper functioning of the public sphere cannot be explained or appreciated.

How did Habermas arrive at his own performative contradiction vis-à-vis literature? In his theory of communicative action, he argues that there are three validity claims implicit in every speech act: cognitive truth, normative rightness, and subjective expressiveness. Aesthetic claims, unlike the normative claims that are vital to other forms of communicative interaction, are not universalizable; they are grounded in culturally specific values and thus cannot be redeemed through argumentation alone. But, Colclasure argues, "Limiting aesthetic rationality to expressive rationality in this way fails to account for the complex workings of aesthetic practice and criticism that, consciously or not, avails itself of validity claims other than that of subjective truthfulness." (p. 13)

To understand why Habermas does not believe that aesthetic works raise validity claims requires that one understand something of his theory of communicative action. As Colclasure explains, at the heart of Habermas' account of the pragmatic grounds of normative claims is his argument that communicative action has an action-coordinating effect. (p. 16) Normative speech acts raise claims that elicit a hearer to take a yes/no position in relation to the claim raised, and, if viewed as legitimate, lead to cooperative social interaction. In Habermas' view, aesthetic works do not coordinate action in this way. He writes,

In everyday communicative practice speech acts have a power that they lose in literary texts. In the former they function in contexts of action with which the participants deal with situations and -- so be it -- must solve problems; in the latter, they are tailored to a reception which relieves the reader of action; the situations which he encounters, the problems which he is confronted with, are not immediately his own. (quoted on p. 47).

Artistic works, Habermas argues, raise claims about subjective experience or disclose ways of understanding the world, but no action imperatives follow from them.

Colclasure, like Habermas, believes that literature does not function exactly like direct forms of communicative interaction, because the reader of a text remains at a distance from the text itself in a way that makes ordinary and aesthetic interactions different from each other, but, he argues, literature, in fact, does have action-coordinating potential, albeit of an indirect sort. As Colclasure puts it,

the redemption of the aesthetic validity claim of a piece of literature depends not on the coordination of particular actions specifiable on the basis of a particular text but rather on the consequences for subsequent actions that the reorientation of a recipient of a piece of literature has or could have. (p. 22)

Literature, (and other forms of art) create a space of reflective interaction which, "by means of its own form of rationality . . . uniquely invigorates public discussion." (p. 23) It is the potential for transformation of the ways we look at the world, the people who act in it and the particular situations that shape them, that makes literature so potentially powerful from a political perspective. Without a way to understand how literature engages normative issues, Habermas has no way of acknowledging that literature can be experienced and appraised not only in relation to what it reveals about the author, or even about the author's culturally specific values, but also how literature engages more general concerns, contests ways of looking at any particular situation, and proposes possible responses to newly disclosed ways of looking at the world.

In exploring how literature makes political transformations possible, Colclasure considers the work of several critics of Habermas who work on aesthetics, including that of Franz Koppe, Albrecht Wellmer and Martin Seel. While he argues that each advances us beyond the limits of Habermas's aesthetic understanding, each also ultimately fails to offer an account of aesthetics that fully explains the potential contribution that works of art, particularly literature, can make to political discussions. Koppe, for example, argues that aesthetic expression is inherently intersubjective and hence a form of communicative reason, but he, like Habermas, ultimately insists that what aesthetic works communicate are shared needs, thus returning art to the fundamentally subjective domain.

Wellmer moves the argument a bit further by recognizing that art invokes claims to truth, truthfulness, and moral-practical rightness. Against Habermas and Koppe, Wellmer argues that aesthetic rationality cannot be reduced to expressive rationality; it is instead a unique form of rationality conceptually derived from all three of the dimensions of rationality that Habermas describes. Like Adorno, Wellmer describes the truth of art as an "interference phenomenon" that is produced through world-disclosure. Art carries with it a "truth-potential," though it does not constitute a truth-claim per se; the truth of art is metaphorical and "the artwork as a symbolic formation with an aesthetic validity claim is simultaneously the object of an experience, in which the three dimensions of truth are un-metaphorically entangled with one another." (p. 65) Though Wellmer recognizes that art raises claims that extend far beyond the expressive domain, in Colclasure's view he leaves the fundamental question about how it does so unanswered.

In pursuit of his understanding of this process, Colclasure turns to the work of Martin Seel. Seel insists that to understand aesthetic rationality one must understand that rationality is itself multi-faceted and that aesthetic rationality is one of its necessary constituents. As Seel writes, "Reason that is not aesthetic is not yet reason; reason that becomes aesthetic is no longer reason." (Seel, The Art of Disjunction, quoted on p. 67) In addition to the aesthetic dimension of rationality are its moral, political, expressive, and reflexive dimensions. Arguing against Habermas's insistence that there are three different domains (the theoretical-instrumental, moral-practical and aesthetic) in which three different forms of validity (truth, normative rightness and truthfulness) operate, Seel claims instead that rationality is the capacity for inter-rational critique. Aesthetic rationality is unique, Seel argues, because it is a vehicle not just of experience, but of meta-experience. That is, artistic experience is an experience not only of the art object but also of the sort of experience to which the art object refers.  The object of an aesthetic experience, in other words, opens the door to one's experience of another's experience. Aesthetic experience is the reflexive experience of experience, and the art object is the occasion for this experience. As Colclasure summarizes Seel's view, "aesthetic experience is not merely the reflexive experience of one's own experience of an object; rather, the aesthetic object is an object of perception that successfully enables the experience of another experience" (p. 73). What is particularly potent about reflexive experience is that it makes it possible for us to re-orient ourselves in relation to what we have experienced and it opens up new possibilities for what we might experience.

While Colclasure applauds Seel's appreciation of the many dimensions of rational experience and the impact that aesthetic works have on our experience of experience, he contends that there are still aspects of aesthetic practices that Seel misses. First, Seel fails to distinguish what is specific about the way that aesthetic experiences reorient us to the world; second, by tying the value of aesthetic works to the extent to which they reorient us in the world, he leaves no way to appreciate that some failures to reorient say much more about those who experience art than they do about the quality of the artistic work; and, third, given Colclasure's own project -- to explain the political impact of art works -- his most serious worry is Seel's insistence that there is a disjunction between aesthetic and practical reorientation. Aesthetic experience is not linked to any goal other than reflexive awareness of experience, i.e., the point of aesthetic experience is to make an experience of experience possible. Seel writes, "Does not the specific aesthetic mission of art lie in creating situations in which situations from our experience can be experienced?" (Seel, quoted on p. 82)

Colclasure worries, however, that if the role of aesthetic experiences need not lead to reorientations that have an impact in the moral or political domain, then Seel is under-estimating the political impact of art. As Colclasure puts it, "Seel essentially wins the independence of aesthetic validity at the cost of making it non-practical." (p. 82) But, Colclasure argues against Seel, initiating new ways of looking at the world necessarily has practical consequences. One is the re-orienting of one's experience of experience, but Colclasure argues, "the notion of aesthetic-validity is not fully captured by the reorienting our worldview-articulating capacity of art . . . . particularly in literature, due to the latter's linguistic medium, the validity of art (as literature) is in fact inseparable from its potential truth-effects." (p. 84) Literary validity, Colclasure argues, has to be measured not by the world-disclosing potential arising from the re-orienting dimension of aesthetic experience, but also by its irreducibly normative and assertory elements.

The normative dimension of literary aesthetics is rooted in the perspectival nature of a literary work. Any literary work offers a perspective on the objective, social, and/or subjective world, and thus necessarily involves taking a stance toward some aspect(s) of those worlds. When we respond critically to a work of literature, we are responding to that stance. The different stances made available through a work of art are persuasive or not depending upon whether they "authentically" capture the truth, rightness, and truthfulness of objects, situations, and characters. It is "the question of whether and in what way a portrayal of shareable experience is authentic," Colclasure claims, that is "the question peculiar to the aesthetic form of rationality." (pp. 87, 89) Because aesthetic rationality revolves around questions of authenticity, he argues, and discussions about authenticity involve arguments not just about ways of looking at the world but, in addition, initiate discussions about ways of acting in the world. Literary works of art are read as raising validity claims and thus have a political function as they initiate discussions about normative claims.

Literature can do this, Colclasure argues,

by producing a rationally grounded resonance in a reading/listening public, which can result, on the basis of the complex claim of authenticity that is internal to the literary institution and negotiable on the basis of the descriptive, normative, and expressive content of a given text and its presentation, in a practically consequential reorientation in the recipients' view of the world. (p. 93)

Literature is not only serving an expressive function in such discussions but also "redefining what counts as a situation of need, an authentic articulation of shareable experience and so on." (p. 97) Because literature can be the vehicle of such discussions, and because such discussions can clarify needs and re-orient political positions, Colclasure argues, they are important to a well-functioning public sphere:

the public sphere in which -- on the basis of experiences that can intersubjectively be attributed authenticity -- not merely issues of generalizable concern, but also the validity of ways of looking at and articulating such issues, is negotiated, is a more effective, i.e., better functioning, public sphere than one in which such experiences are not reflexively experienced and publicly articulated. (pp. 96-97)

It is precisely this potential that explains Habermas' claim that moral discourses must sometimes turn to literature because the "creative process of semantization . . . unleashes potential for new meanings via the non-propositional symbolic systems of literature, art and music." (pp. 51-52) Literature is ultimately an effort to represent experience as shareable, to offer what Colclasure calls an allegory, without "simultaneously raising claims about its truth and normative content." (p. 108)

Colclasure offers as an example of a politically important public discussion of literature the public reception of Wolfgang Hilbig's work, focusing on his novel, Ich. This discussion took place during the period of the re-unification of East and West Germany, and created an important discursive space, however fore-closed, for discussions about that process. They are evidence, Colclasure argues, that literature raises not just claims about expressive truthfulness, but normative ones as well. Hilbig depicted the relationships created by life under the Stasi in the East and the promises of bourgeois capitalism in the West. His depictions of people and life in the novel, all ultimately resting on normative insights and claims to authenticity, served as a vehicle for exploring guilt, responsibility, agency and freedom as experienced both in West and East Germany.

Hilbig's novel was read as just expressing the experience of its author, but at the same time it challenged its readers' views of the objective, social and subjective worlds and the relationships between them. Discussions about his book made these normative insights "the focus of the public reflection on the intimate connections between personal memory and collective history," and impelled Germans to explore questions about inauthentic identities and failed intersubjective relations during a particular historical period. Claims about subjective truthfulness, normative rightness, and descriptive truth are all evoked by the novel and reflected in the discussions it provoked. It offered not only an allegory of shared experience, but it initiated discussions about these experiences and about how to change practical relations in the world in light of these experiences.

The normative nature of Hilbig's book and the discussions it elicited cannot, Colclasure argues, be captured under the rubric of claims about the truthfulness or sincerity of the author, though Hilbig's narrative voice was one that was powerfully positioned in the interstices of a complex social space, lending a certain authorial legitimacy to his insights. Ultimately, however, his book has to be assessed not in terms of the author's subjectivity, but in terms of "the shareability of the representation of the historical situation that the text embodies . . . . as throwing the relation between personal identity and shared history in the former GDR and newly unified Germany into a radically new light." (pp. 109-110)  It, like other aesthetic works, not only discloses the world to us, but can indirectly re-orient the ways we act in the world and, Colclasure concludes, it is in doing so that aesthetic works uniquely contribute to the political public sphere. And, it is their capacity to do so that is the measure of their communicative potential and aesthetic quality.

Colclasure's argument that literature raises claims that are not captured under Habermas' rubric of expressivity is undoubtedly right, and, to my mind, very important. As he points out, Habermas' own passionate contributions to political discussions about literature suggest just how unpersuasive his theoretical position vis-à-vis aesthetics actually is. Colclasure's book carefully and helpfully explores a (somewhat limited) range of the critical literature on Habermas' rather undeveloped aesthetic views and teases out some notions helpful for understanding how literature is a vehicle for descriptive and normative claims, as well as expressive ones. Most important of these are his discussion of authenticity and allegory.

Regrettably, however, Colclasure does not develop these ideas at any length, though they are actually quite critical for the ultimate success of his argument. We need to know more about both if we are to critically appreciate the normative dimensions of literature. Colclasure suggests that literature does more than induce moral arguments that can then be discursively pursued -- his critique of Seel points in this direction -- but, in the final analysis, despite pages of dense argumentation, he leaves us wondering how it does so. What distinguishes an allegory from any other kind of narrative, what makes an allegory authentic? Is shareability enough of a criteria for authenticity? One only wishes that Colclasure had developed his own argument as fully as he does his criticisms of Koppe, Wellmer and Seel.