Hallucination: Philosophy and Psychology

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Fiona Macpherson and Dimitris Platchias (eds.), Hallucination: Philosophy and Psychology, MIT Press, 2013, 421pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262019200.

Reviewed by Clare Batty, University of Kentucky


The notion of hallucination has played a pivotal role in the philosophy of perception. From arguments for indirect realism, to representational views of experience, to recent discussions of direct realism and disjunctivism, hallucination has shaped our theorizing about, and understanding of, the nature of perceptual experience. Fiona Macpherson and Dimitris Platchias' volume contains sixteen previously unpublished papers on hallucination -- five in psychology and neuroscience, and eleven in philosophy. Originally presented at the conference "Hallucination on Crete" (2008), the papers form an exciting, and much-needed, volume.

The volume is anchored by Macpherson's Introduction. As with all her introductions, it is ambitious, clear and extremely thorough -- an excellent set up for the papers that follow. She gives a tightly woven exposition of key terms, a summary of the historical and contemporary debates driven by the notion of hallucination, and the proposal of future directions to take -- both philosophical and scientific -- in investigating the nature of hallucination. Especially notable is her introduction to the philosophical domain of two further conceptions of hallucination -- the contingent disjunctive conception and the imagery/memory conception. (I turn to the standing conceptions below.) In short, it is a nice combination of introductory and substantive material, written for the newcomer as well as those already familiar with the topic.

The scientific papers make up Part I and, overall, form a tightly knit set. Unsurprisingly, the focus is not on what we can, or cannot, learn about the nature of hallucination by introspective means -- as has been favored by philosophers. Rather, it is on what we can learn about hallucinations by considering neurophysiological, as well as other empirical, evidence.

The first three papers of Part I -- those of Dominic ffytche, Richard Bentall and Filippo Varese, and Charles Fernyhough and Simon McCarthy-Jones -- consider whether we ought to think of hallucination as imagery-based. As I noted above, this is a notion of hallucination that Macpherson introduces. As she tells us, on the imagery/memory conception of hallucination, one's hallucinatory experience has a phenomenal character different from that of veridical experience; it is the same phenomenal character had by perceptual rememberings and perceptual imaginings. ffychte argues that certain cases of 'actual hallucinations' -- in particular, the visual hallucinations of Charles Bonnet syndrome -- do not support this conception of hallucination. According to ffychte, neuroimaging suggests that those hallucinations are "experiential", with underlying brain activation occurring in centers commonly associated with visual experience, and not in those associated with visual imagery or visual memory.

Bentall and Varese, as well as Fernyhough and McCarthy-Jones, consider the imagery/memory conception for a different domain: auditory-verbal hallucinations (AVHs). Bentall and Varese note that it is now commonplace to accept what is called the 'inner speech model' of AVHs. On that model, AVHs are the result of a failure of 'source monitoring,' i.e., a failure to discriminate between inner speech and auditory events in the external world. According to the inner speech model, then, AVHs are instances of imagery-based hallucinations. Although, as they claim, neurophysiological data do not support this view, Bentall and Varese argue that behavioral studies support the source monitoring model and, in Macpherson's terms, the imagery/memory conception of hallucination for AVHs.

Although Fernyhough and McCarthy-Jones also favor the inner speech model, and the view that AVHs are imagery-based, they allege that the success of this model has been overstated. It has encountered significant difficulty in explaining certain salient features of AVHs (e.g., the fact that hallucinated voices have person-specific characteristics that are alien to the sufferer). Fernyhough and McCarthy-Jones propose a developmental approach to understanding the nature of these hallucinations and argue that such an approach can handle those difficulties encountered by the traditional approach.

Peter Naish's paper deals with the nature of hallucination; he does not, however, employ any of the categories Macpherson discussesd. He considers hypnosis-induced hallucinations and, in particular, those features of them that are non-suggested. He observes that both hypnosis-induced hallucinations and hallucinations of other conditions, such as schizophrenia, involve time distortion. Given this commonality, Naish hypothesizes that the processes that underlie time distortion could provide a key to locating, and understanding, the processes that underlie pathological hallucinations. As a result, a significant portion of his paper involves canvassing the relevant scientific literature on the neurophysiological basis of time distortion.

Ksenija Maravic da Silva's paper departs somewhat from these. This is because she deals with the causes of visual hallucinatory experience rather than the nature of the experience itself. In particular, she considers whether the same risk factors for visual hallucination are associated with normal subjects as are associated with Parkinson's patients. She argues that, while the risk factors are similar in each population, the predisposition for visual hallucinations in normal subjects is also driven by a specific personality profile. For the philosopher, it might seem that this paper provides less to sink one's teeth into than the others. And in one way this is right. Maravic da Silva's discussion of her results is much less reflective than the others in Part I. Still, although she doesn't pinpoint them, there are interesting questions raised by her results -- questions that serve to tie the paper in more directly with others in the section and with Macpherson's call for further conceptions of hallucination. For instance, her discussion raises the question of whether it would be feasible, and useful, to categorize hallucinations in terms of their causal histories and, in turn, investigate how that history impacts their phenomenology and content.

Part II's seven papers consider disjunctivism. Central to the debate about disjunctivism is the 'philosopher's hallucination'. This is the idea of an experience phenomenally indistinguishable from some possible veridical experience, but in which the object of experience is absent.[1] The possibility of such a hallucination has traditionally been taken to support the common kind conception of hallucination: the idea that hallucinations and their matching veridical experiences are of the same kind. Disjunctivism, a form of direct realism, rejects this conception and, in turn, the common kind theory of experience. According to disjunctivists, common kind theories of experience fail to explain the phenomenology of experience as well as the role that experience plays in grounding knowledge of individual objects. In response, disjunctivism claims that we are in direct contact with the world; the very objects and property instances in our environment constitute the phenomenal character of a veridical experience. Because there are no such objects and properties in the hallucinatory case, hallucinations lack phenomenal character. They are, as a result, a different type of state than their veridical counterparts. To be sure, they seem to be the same type of state. But, according to disjunctivism, all that they have in common with veridical experiences is a negative epistemic property -- namely, the property of being in a state in which it is impossible to know, by introspection alone, whether you are veridically perceiving. Given that hallucinations have no phenomenal character, this negative epistemic property accounts for their phenomenology; as it is often said, there is nothing more to say about hallucinations than that they have it. This conception of hallucination is known as the epistemic conception of hallucination.

Three of Part II's papers defend disjunctivism. Three others argue for 'hybrid views' -- views that preserve features of both disjunctivism and the common kind view. One, Howard Robinson's, argues against disjunctivism.

Robinson restates the causal argument against direct realism (or for the common kind view) and argues that three main attempts to refute it ultimately fail. The other papers focus primarily on M. G. F. Martin's disjunctivism, so Robinson's paper is distinctive. He discusses Martin's disjunctivism and addresses John McDowell's version of the view as well as Mark Johnston's view of experience, which, as Robinson argues, has disjunctivist features. Robinson's arguments against Martin focus on Martin's notion of indiscriminability. Against him, Robinson argues that facts about indiscriminability must be based on something. In particular, he argues that the indiscriminability of matching hallucinations and veridical experiences must be indiscriminability with respect to some shared feature. Moreover, Robinson claims that, if we deny this notion of indiscriminability and stick with Martin's primitive notion of it, we are led similarly back to a common kind view. For if having a negative epistemic property is enough to explain the phenomenology of a hallucination, it is enough to explain its matching veridical experience.

Matthew Nudds, István Aranyosi, and Benj Hellie all defend disjunctivism. Nudds' main aim is to defend disjunctivism against the claim that it does not explain the fact that, in hallucination, there seem to be objects and properties present -- the "sensory character" of hallucination, as he puts it. As he argues, disjunctivism can provide such an explanation. In the case of hallucination generally, that explanation is in terms of indiscriminability -- rather than in terms of any properties of objects, as in the case of veridical experience. Case by case, he argues, there is the possibility of saying something further about what grounds the sensory character of hallucinations -- in terms of various visual processes and states of the brain. As far as the objection goes, then, Nudds concludes that the disjunctivist can provide both a local and general explanation of how hallucinations have the sensory character they do. In an attempt to avoid the claim that this sounds too easy, he spends the latter portion of the paper defending his response against further objections.

Aranyosi also deals with indiscriminability and, in particular, with the claim that indiscriminability entitles us to conclude that there is a common nature to both veridical and hallucinatory experiences. He argues that it does not. He appeals to an auditory case and, in particular, the idea that we can both hear and hallucinate silence. On the basis of the claim that hearing silence is indistinguishable, or possibly indistinguishable, from being deaf (i.e., not hearing anything at all), Aranyosi draws the following general principle: it is possible for two indistinguishable states to be of radically different kinds. Given that hearing silence and hallucinating silence are also indistinguishable, He applies this principle to conclude, contra common kind theories, that veridical experiences of silence as well as their matching hallucinations can be of different kinds. Although I thought that Aranyosi needed to spend more time arguing for the claim that hearing silence is distinct from failing to hear anything at all, his paper provides a novel way of motivating the epistemic conception of hallucination. If Aranyosi is right that we can make sense of hearing and hallucinating silence, disjunctivism can get its foot in the door without appealing to its typical phenomenological and epistemological motivations -- namely, the object-involving nature of visual experience.

Both Nudds and Aranyosi do a particularly nice job of clarifying and addressing key issues in the recent debate about disjunctivism. Each provides an excellent port of entry into the recent debate and, for this reason, their papers might have been better placed first in the section. The first three -- those of Hellie, Fabian Dorsch and Matthew Kennedy -- are the most challenging of the lot. For readers unfamiliar with the debate, they will present a significant task. Still, they are well worth it.

Like Nudds and Aranyosi, Hellie is not in the business of defending a common kind view of hallucination. His sympathies lie with disjunctivism. Unlike Nudds and Aranyosi, however, Hellie does not adopt the epistemic conception of hallucination. As he reconstructs it, Martin's argument for disjunctivism is an argument from elimination. Hellie's main aim is to argue that Martin does not eliminate all of the alternative views. According to Hellie, the view that it fails to rule out is an additional form of disjunctivism that rejects the epistemic conception of hallucination -- what he calls multidisjunctivism. According to multidisjunctivism, although indistinguishable hallucinations do not share a fundamental kind with their veridical counterparts, they have a fundamental structure that grounds that indistinguishability. That structure varies case by case. (Hellie argues that the view according to which hallucinations have a common kind -- unidisjunctivism -- is covered by Martin's argument.) As I understand Hellie's discussion, because matching hallucinations have such a structure, and do not simply have the negative epistemic property, multidisjunctivism avoids the epistemic conception of hallucination.

Those papers that argue for what I have called 'hybrid' views also vary with respect to whether they uphold, or reject, the epistemic conception of hallucination. In a view that he calls experiential intentionalism, Dorsch argues that the epistemic conception of hallucination is compatible with a version of common kind theory. His argument rests on an important distinction between the first person character of experience and the third person structure of it. In line with common kind theory, experiential intentionalism upholds the view that indistinguishable hallucinations and veridical experiences have a common first person character. That character is grounded in a shared intentional content -- hence, the label 'intentionalism'. But, drawing on disjunctivism, Dorsch argues that they do not have a shared third person structure. Veridical experiences relate us to objects and properties in the world; hallucinations do not. At the level of structure, then, matching hallucinations and their veridical counterparts do not share common features; so, as I took Dorsch, the epistemic conception of hallucination is vindicated. But, as he argues, that does not preclude us from characterizing indistinguishability positively, in terms of sameness of content and character. On Dorsch's view, then, intentionalism and disjunctivism are compatible because they explain different features of experience.

Like Dorsch, Kennedy proposes a hybrid view. Unlike Dorsch, however, he aims to avoid the epistemic conception of hallucination. In particular, Kennedy argues that we can achieve one of Martin's key aims -- namely, to vindicate the idea that introspective reflection supports a direct realist view of experience -- without endorsing the epistemic conception. In order to do this, Kennedy argues that we need to question the connection between phenomenal character and introspection. Drawing on considerations of transparency, Kennedy argues that object-involving judgments made on the basis of introspection are not judgments about phenomenal character; they are about the world itself. The naïve structure of veridical experience -- the subject's relation to the objects and properties in the world -- grounds these judgments; it does not ground phenomenal character, as Martin claims. Introspection, then, supports a direct realist view; Martin's aim is achieved. But all of this, Kennedy argues, is compatible with a common kind view of veridical and hallucinatory experience. According to him, indistinguishable veridical and hallucinatory experiences have "[common] structure level properties" (p. 246); they both represent the same general proposition, which, on my understanding, grounds their indistinguishability -- or phenomenal character, we might say. (In his final section, Kennedy does go on to raise questions about the concept of phenomenal character itself.) We avoid the epistemic conception of hallucination, then, because there is a common structure to matching hallucinations and veridical experiences.

There are significant similarities between Dorsch's and Kennedy's papers. Both Dorsch and Kennedy claim that veridical experience is relational; each also holds that matching hallucinations and veridical experiences share a common content. Yet Dorsch upholds the epistemic conception of hallucination and Kennedy does not. The crucial difference between them seems to be that, unlike Dorsch, Kennedy characterizes shared intentional content as a structure-level feature of those experiences. With this, Kennedy rejects the epistemic conception. Comparing these two papers, then, raises several important questions: just what is meant by 'structure-level' in the case of experience, how is it that a property gets to 'live' at that level, and what role does that structure play in upholding, or rejecting, the epistemic conception of hallucination? These questions are also relevant to Nudds and Hellie. Each holds that hallucinations have a further 'positive' structure that will vary case by case. But, in Hellie's case, that further structure contributes to his rejection of the epistemic conception.

Susanna Schellenberg argues for what she calls a moderate externalism -- a view that preserves features of both disjunctivism and common kind theories. According to her, having an experience involves employing capacities to single out objects and properties. These capacities are perceptual capacities, exercised in a "sensory mode", and "yield contents as outputs" (298). She also talks of content as being "constituted" by these capacities, which, when taken together with talk of capacities yielding (or "ensuing") outputs, is rather puzzling. Still, it is clear that, on Schellenberg's view, indistinguishable hallucinations and veridical experiences both employ the same type of capacity. The type of capacity employed is individuated by what it would single out in the veridical case. In the case of hallucination, the capacity employed is baseless. Like the disjunctivist, then, Schellenberg claims that hallucinations are to be understood in terms of a deficiency of veridical experience. In terms of content, there is an aspect of it that hallucinations do not share with veridical experiences. Nevertheless, the fact that indistinguishable hallucinations and veridical experiences employ the same type of capacity is something that they have in common and, according to Schellenberg, constitutes an aspect of their content that they do share. This shared aspect of content, as I understand it, explains their indistinguishability. She develops this view as one according to which contents are potentially gappy modes of presentation.

The four papers in Part III consider more general questions about hallucination and perceptual experience. A lot can fall under the label 'the nature of experience'. The papers of Costas Pagondiotis, Paul Coates and Katalin Farkas hang together quite nicely; they all consider, in some way, the presentational character of experience (to use Pagondiotis' term). Ian Phillips' paper considers the question of whether perceptual awareness can be object-less.

Phillips' paper provides a nice supplement to Aranyosi's on disjunctivism. It is devoted to developing an argument for the claim that we can hear, and hallucinate, silence. Phillips argues against the view that awareness of silence is cognitive by questioning the "austere" picture of conscious experience that underlies it -- namely, the idea that experience necessarily involves a relation between a subject and an object. He provides two arguments against this view. First, he argues that we can hear, and hallucinate, certain forms of silence through time, and by contrast -- as in the case of pauses, or the appearance of pauses. But, as he claims, there is a much stronger second argument to be made, "one that allows for simply experiencing silence" (p. 344). Drawing on G. E. Moore's claim that sensation "can be distinguished if we look enough" (quoted by Phillips, p. 345), Phillips suggests that, in the absence of awareness of an object, there can still be awareness itself. On what seems to be his preferred way of developing this idea, and drawing on Martin's (1992, 1993) discussion of vision and touch, Phillips suggests that we have awareness of periods of time as potential occasions for sound. Listening for sounds, "opening the attention to the influence of sound" (p. 357), serves as an example of this kind of awareness.

Moving to presentational character, Pagondiotis argues against indirect realism on the grounds that it cannot account for the presentational character of experience. But what is of most interest in his paper is his positive view. Although I must set details aside, he argues that we must account for presentational character in terms of "how the way things sensorily look changes relative to our position and our bodily movement or rest" (p. 375, his emphasis). According to Pagondiotis, it is only by doing so that we can understand ourselves, as we should, as subjects embedded in an environment. For the purposes of the volume, what is especially important to note is what this view claims about the nature of hallucination and, in particular, the upshot it has for the philosopher's notion of an indistinguishable hallucination. According to Pagondiotis, even if those changes in how things look in a hallucination were indistinguishable from how they look in a veridical experience, the difference between them could be revealed by an accompanied sense of passivity with the hallucination -- as we might expect in the case of actual hallucinations. As I understand him, then, we ought to re-think the very possibility of the philosopher's hallucination -- either that, or re-think what we mean by 'indistinguishability'.

Coates considers what answering the theoretical demands of transparency can tell us about the nature of hallucination. At the start, he reminds us that the transparency of experience is often taken as a motivation for direct realism. His aim is to show that transparency is compatible with the view that perceptual experiences are inner states and, in particular, a version of this view known as critical realism. According to critical realism, perceptual experiences have two components -- a phenomenal one and a conceptual one. In short, given that there is a conceptual component to experience, it is possible for the phenomenal aspect of experience to become reconceptualized. What this allows is a shift from conceptualizing the phenomenal aspect of one's experience in terms of mind-independent objects to conceptualizing it, at least in part, in experiential terms; this is introspection. The transparency intuition is placed at the first stage of introspection and so, according to Coates, is compatible with an 'inner states' view. According to Coates, this model can provide a way of explaining what happens when a subject realizes that her experience is deceptive. In short, what occurs is a reconceptualization of the phenomenal aspects of experience -- from exercising concepts of mind-independent entities and properties to exercising those pertaining to one's own experience.

Finally, Farkas considers the question: what features are required for an experience and, in particular, a hallucination to "feel real" -- that is, for it to have a 'sense of reality'? What we find is that, while it is possible to isolate several criteria, answering this question is not easy. Drawing on criteria first presented by the Danish psychologist Anton Aggernaes, Farkas argues that necessary to a sense of reality is that a subject takes the object of an experience to be mind-independent. In turn, she asks: what does 'taking an object to be mind-independent' involve in the case of hallucination? At the very least, she suggests, we can say that it must occur involuntarily and in a "sensory mode". Still, as she notes, mental imagery is sensory, and some mental images are involuntary. Something more is required, then, to explain what 'taking an object to be mind-independent' is for the hallucinatory case. Farkas then considers the possibility that content might contribute to the sense of reality in the case of hallucination. It seems right to say that we are much less likely to consider a perceived state of affairs as real if it is highly unlikely. And, as she notes, empirical studies suggest that content can play a significant role in determining experienced reality. In a shift from what has been the norm in philosophy, and with a nice nod to the papers in the psychology section, her concluding remarks suggest that focusing on actual hallucinations might serve us equally well, or even better, when considering certain questions about perceptual experience.

Martin, M. G. F. 1992. "Sight and Touch." In T. Crane (ed.), The Contents of Experience. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

---. 1993. "Sense Modalities and Spatial Properties." In N. Eilan, R. McCarthy and B. Brewer (eds.), Spatial Representation. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

[1] In what follows, I will drop ‘possible’ from ‘possible veridical experience’ and leave it as understood.