Happy Lives and the Highest Good: an essay on Aristotle's Nicomachean Ethics

Placeholder book cover

Lear, Gabriel Richardson, Happy Lives and the Highest Good: an essay on Aristotle's Nicomachean Ethics, Princeton University Press, 2004, 256pp, $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 069114668.

Reviewed by Julia Annas, University of Arizona


Most of Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics discusses the life of moral virtue, exercised in accordance with practical reasoning, a life taken in the opening passages to be necessary for happiness or eudaimonia, though not sufficient, since some measure of external goods is also required. This is the position regarded as Aristotelian in ancient ethical debate throughout the following period. Our text of the Nicomachean Ethics, however, ends with a passage urging that a life of human happiness lies in contemplation or study (theoria) of the highest objects of the intellect.

Can we resolve this puzzle without examining what kind of text our Nicomachean Ethics is? Were the passages we read as Book I and Book X even intended to form part of the same philosophical work? Here we find a range of responses, at one extreme of which is Jonathan Barnes, who in his discussion of the ancient transmission of Aristotle’s works, puts the point with characteristic force: ‘[O]ur EN is an absurdity, surely put together by a desperate scribe or an unscrupulous bookseller and not united by an author or an editor’.1 Gabriel Richardson Lear assumes that the Nicomachean Ethics is a literary unity; she regards it as containing a progressive argument (p 146) entitling her, for example, to use passages in Book X to illuminate the earlier discussion of to kalon and suggesting that the reason Aristotle is not more informative in the earlier passage is that ‘he is not fully in the position to do so’ until Book X.2 This puts her at or near the opposite extreme from Barnes, but she nowhere defends her assumptions about the text, and explicitly (p 5) lays aside the relationship of the Nicomachean to the Eudemian version. Given the very different interpretative assumptions that scholars make about the text, it would have been helpful to have had serious discussion of the literary problems our text offers.

Lear uses Aristotle’s other works to interpret crucial parts of his views on happiness, taking the Nicomachean Ethics to be understood properly only in the context of Aristotle’s physical and metaphysical works, rather than as a self-standing work. She also at several places suggests interesting deep affinities between Aristotle and Plato. This gives her a distinctive approach to the much-fought-over discussion of our final end in the opening passages of the Ethics. She joins the currently growing number of scholars finding Aristotle’s final end to be monistic, rather than inclusivist. Her account of Book I argues that the inclusivist approach is wrong because for Aristotle our telos should be taken to be the ‘technical’ (p 3) notion we find in the Physics and biological works: a normative standard for the performance of an activity. The human telos will thus not be what puts an end to desire but will rather be the goal appropriate to our nature and essence, something which determines the success and value of human activities. Given this account of our telos, we find that when an end is for the sake of another end, this must mean ‘at least that the higher ends provide the criteria of success for the subordinate ones’ (p 17). Lower ends are given their value by their role in contributing to the higher ends. Since happiness is the ‘most final’ end, we are led to an account of our highest end as monistic, with all other ends subordinate to success in achieving it.

Lear follows through the apparently drastic result that there appears to be no place in this conception for what she calls ‘mid-level ends’, ends choiceworthy for themselves and also for their contribution to our final end. She ingeniously finds such a place via the notion of ‘approximation’: ends such as virtuous activity can be choiceworthy for their own sakes and also by virtue of approximating the activity constituting our final end. This notion of approximation is also taken from the physical and biological works, including the way the Prime Mover functions as a final cause and the way that the reproduction of animals approximates the activity of the Prime Mover, at De Anima II 4.

Approximation gives us a way in which a lower end can be related to a higher one that is neither instrumental nor constitutive, and this paves the way for an ingenious solution to the problem of mid-level ends on a monistic interpretation. Morally virtuous activity approximates contemplation, according to Lear, and thus we can reconcile taking contemplation to be our monistic final end with the fact that most of the Ethics is devoted to studying practical reasoning in the exercise of moral virtue. Our final end is contemplation, but the exercise of moral virtue is choiceworthy for its own sake, since it is an approximation of contemplation.

Readers may be worried that, as Lear admits, ‘Aristotle never explicitly says that excellent practical reasoning is good because its essence is defined with reference to wise contemplation’ (p 90). The second half of the book attempts to meet these worries. In Chapter 5 she argues that theoretical and practical reasoning are both to be understood as aiming at truth in different ways, such as precision, in terms of which theoretical reasoning is superior. This is the most speculative part of the book, and, although the ideas are suggestive and interesting, much remains unclear in the claims that Aristotle is talking about ‘living truthfully’ (p 99) and attaining theoretical and practical truthfulness. Lear is clearer in her account of the moral virtues (she deals with courage, temperance and greateness of soul), in a way elucidating how their practice might be understood as an approximation of theoretical contemplation. She focuses on the fine or kalon as the object of virtuous action, giving all virtuous activity an object which is an object of practice determined as what it is by a conception of what is objectively good for humans; this is what she claims as the basis for the way the fine is elsewhere said to be the principle of order, symmetry and boundedness. Each moral choice thus shows that the moral agent has some conception of human flourishing; since this is in fact contemplation, ‘morally virtuous actions will be fine and worth choosing for their own sakes because they are appropriate to the philosopher, whether the virtuous agent understands this or not’. Courageous actions, for example, express a commitment to ‘the excellent rational use of a leisurely citizen’s life’ (p 149, 159); the citizen soldier thinks death in battle worth it because of his commitment as a citizen to the common life of the city; and this in turn is worth it because it allows for leisure, whose best use is contemplation. Only the philosopher will have full understanding of the point of virtuous actions, and this enables Lear in her final chapter to avoid the usual ‘competition’ between the active life and the life of contemplation, since doing everything for the sake of contemplation emerges from a deeper understanding of moral virtue rather than philosophers’ self-interested modification of it.

Lear is quite explicit that the soldier dying on the battlefield may not realize that ‘the exercise of courage approximates contemplation by being structurally similar to it, insofar as it is an exercise of practical reason and truthfulness’ (p 161); only philosophers will understand that. The same is true of any exercise of practical reasoning in virtue: the courageous, the temperate and those with greatness of soul need not understand that what they do is done for the sake of contemplation (though to be virtuous it has to be done for the sake of the fine, something which requires understanding the nature of practical reasoning and its proper aims). Most of us most of the time, even if we make progress in virtue, are thus missing an understanding of what ultimately makes our actions valuable. Lear seems to think that this result is not so strange when we bear in mind that the exercise of practical reason is choiceworthy for itself in being an approximation of theoretical reasoning. But problems remain which Lear’s discussion stimulates without settling.

One is the question of the audience. Lear makes casual reference to Aristotle’s audience ‘who have been raised in fine habits’ (e.g., p 121). On Lear’s view the audience for the Ethics will radically fail to understand it if they attend to it alone. They will understand it only if they come equipped with knowledge of Aristotle’s physical and metaphysical works, and prepared to interpret the work from the beginning in the light of ideas which are expressed only at the end—only if, that is, they come equipped with Lear’s own interpretative batteries. Now this is certainly possible: the fact that the Ethics does not contain the crucial notions in Lear’s interpretation does not mean that we can understand everything in it by studying it alone. Nonetheless, the distance between Lear’s interpretation and interpretations which treat the discussion of moral virtue as self-standing rather than radically underdescribed suggests the need for some attention to the question of how the Ethics was intended to be read, and by whom. These are interestingly different problems from the ones usually thought to arise from the fact that Book X turns up in our Nicomachean Ethics, but they remain problems nonetheless.

The book is rewarding for its close study of several of Aristotle’s most vexed passages in an accessible and imaginative way; particularly worthwhile are the discussions of self-sufficiency (bringing in the related passages from Plato’s Philebus), the kalon and ‘greatness of soul’. The book is most likely to convince of its main theses those who share its substantial methodological assumptions, and it would have been helpful to have had explicit discussion of these. The book will also be valuable in furthering examination of deep similarities between Aristotle’s ethical thought and that of Plato, which I have not had the scope to examine here.


1Barnes adds in a footnote: ‘That our EN is not a unity is beyond controversy—the existence of two treatments of pleasure is enough to prove the fact. The only questions concern who invented our text, and when, and from what materials, and for what motives.’ ( p 58-9 of Jonathan Barnes, ‘Roman Aristotle,’ in Jonathan Barnes and Miriam Griffin (eds), Philosophia Togata II:Plato and Aristotle at Rome, Oxford University Press 1997, pp 1-69.)

2She also claims (apparently on the basis of her overall interpretation) that Book VI has a ‘protreptic’ structure (pp 93-4).