Having In Mind: The Philosophy of Keith Donnellan

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Joseph Almog and Paolo Leonardi (eds.), Having In Mind: The Philosophy of Keith Donnellan, Oxford University Press, 2012, 208pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199844845.

Reviewed by Julie Wulfemeyer, Colgate University


This volume gathers new critical essays on the work of Keith Donnellan. It includes contributions from John Perry, Howard Wettstein, Tyler Burge, David Kaplan, Joseph Almog, Erin Eaker, Antonio Capuano, and Andrea Bianchi. The topics of these essays vary considerably, as do their ways of connecting with Donnellan's work. There are chapters offering aerial views -- those aiming to illuminate Donnellan's place in the philosophy of mind and language by locating his views among others in the philosophical taxonomy. These would surely prove helpful starting points for the relatively uninitiated, but the perspectives offered are unique enough to also be of interest to the well-versed. Other chapters focus more narrowly on Donnellan's own views, suggesting novel (re-) interpretations of his work, or at least significant shifts in interpretive emphasis. Still other chapters launch original projects that are in one way or another Donnellan-inspired. Several chapters seem to combine two or more of these aims.

Antonio Capuano's "The Ground Zero of Semantics" serves as an appropriate choice for the volume's first critical essay. The piece provides a quick and clear introduction for those unfamiliar with Donnellan's work, but it also offers deep insight into Donnellan's place among other giants in the philosophy of language. Capuano distinguishes between two fundamentally opposed ways of viewing semantics. One sees semantics as grounded in denotation -- this, Capuano claims, is exemplified in the work of Frege and Kripke. The other grounds semantics in reference and is exemplified, according to Capuano, in the work of Russell and Donnellan. This treatment cuts to the core of the differences between these four thinkers. Where other philosophical histories have run Frege and Russell together and opposed them to Donnellan and Kripke, Capuano correctly frames the debate another way, with battle lines drawn between Russell and Donnellan on one side, Frege and Kripke on the other, with the question of the semantic role of cognitive relations between speakers and objects occupying center stage.

In "Donnellan's Blocks", John Perry draws upon Donnellan's work on the problem of empty names, primarily in "Speaking of Nothing". In particular, Perry makes use of two Donnellian notions: first, the idea that there are historical chains connecting uses of names, and second, the idea that these chains can and sometimes do end in blocks -- i.e., when the chain is traced back through history, we find that nothing ultimately answers to the name. Perry's central innovation involves positing multiple levels of content. He claims that in cases involving empty names, which lack referential content, other levels of content -- in particular "network-bound content", which Perry connects to Donnellan's historical chains -- can step in for referential content and serve as what-is-said.

Perry's article will likely meet resistance as a result of what looks like an overly narrow description of referentialism -- one that assumes proposition-based semantics. According to Perry, "A theory that does not support this way of talking won't do." One would like to see an argument within the essay for this claim, as the narrow formulation of referentialism in turn yields a narrow formulation of the paper's central problem regarding empty names. The problem, as Perry sets it up, turns on the idea that empty names have no referents to contribute to the propositions expressed by sentences containing them. Some will agree that empty names pose a genuine problem for referentialism while questioning whether it's really this problem as opposed to some broader one. Of course none of this is to count against the ingenuity of Perry's development of Donnellan's ideas or its viability as a solution to the problem as Perry sets it up. But the development is unlikely to appeal to those who, perhaps like Donnellan himself, are reluctant to make propositional content the central issue.

In "Donnellan on the Necessary A Posteriori", Erin Eaker addresses what has seemed to some an unexpected consequence of treating natural kind terms as directly referring expressions: the idea that certain "theoretical identifications of science" (e.g., "Water is H20") turn out to express necessary a posteriori truths. Eaker identifies two polarized alternatives emerging from the discussion of the necessary a posteriori. The first rejects natural kinds and essences and reduces necessity to analyticity. The second supports realism about natural kinds and essences and offers a "robustly metaphysical" (as opposed to a primarily logical/linguistic) notion of necessity. Eaker's stated aim is to explore a Donnellan-inspired middle course between these alternatives. Drawing upon both published and unpublished papers, Eaker compares Donnellan's view with those of Kripke and Putnam. All three are united against descriptivism. However, Eaker argues, where Kripke and Putnam anchor natural kind terms to unique kinds from some initial baptism, Donnellan's view allows for changes in the semantics of natural kind terms consistent with actual scientific practice. The article identifies applications of Donnellan's work relevant to epistemology, metaphysics, and the philosophy of language, but also speaks to the task of philosophy more generally. Eaker sees Donnellan's middle ground as one in which "the philosopher is not conceived of as the wielder of a special organ of a priori insight, nor is he merely the bookkeeper for science who separates out the contributions of the theory from the contributions of the world."

Andrea Bianchi's "Two Ways of Being a (Direct) Referentialist" offers an instructive breakdown of what we might think of as the direct reference taxonomy. Focusing on the anti-Fregean "uprising" led by Donnellan, Kripke, Putnam, and Kaplan (leading to what Bianchi calls the "referentialist turn"), the author identifies two competing models of the functioning of natural language. On the psychological model, the mind of the speaker plays a part in determining reference -- e.g., it is because a speaker is thinking of x that her use of a given expression refers to x. On this model, speakers are the primary referrers, linguistic expressions refer only derivatively, and chains of communication are best understood when we emphasize the intentions of individual speakers at each step. On the social model, in contrast, semantic rules, baptisms, and historical chains can play important roles in determining the reference of an expression, but the mind of a particular user of the language does not. On this model, it is primarily linguistic expressions that refer, while speakers do so only derivatively, and chains of communication are understood with an emphasis on the social transmission of names rather than the intentions of individual speakers. Bianchi delivers on his title's promise by offering these two ways of being a referentialist, but one might think of this piece as situating philosophers on a double-axis taxonomy. The psychological model and the social model agree along one axis: both are anti-descriptivist. But they disagree along another: the psychological model is subjectivist while the social model is anti-subjectivist. Bianchi's breakdown thus reveals, in addition to these models, two ways of being a non-referentialist: on Bianchi's reading, one can combine non-referentialism with subjectivism, like Frege, or with anti-subjectivism, like Burge and Dummet. Thus Bianchi's useful taxonomy identifies not only two ways of being a referentialist, but also four ways of being a philosopher of language, all alongside a diagnosis of the historical difficulty in drawing the battle lines between the field's major players.

In "Having in Mind", Howard Wettstein distills two closely related theses in Donnellan's thought. The first is the thesis that definite descriptions can be used referentially. The second is the thesis that, as Wettstein puts it, "Intention trumps literal meaning" -- i.e., that reference can succeed even in cases where the description used doesn't fit the object to which a speaker intends to refer. The separation of these theses comes packaged within an impeccably careful discussion of the Kripke-Donnellan exchange of the 60s and 70s. While many of Donnellan's critics, Kripke most prominent among them, have treated the intention-trumps-convention thesis as the root idea, Wettstein argues that it is instead the first thesis that serves as Donnellan's theoretical core. Wettstein's interpretation thus runs counter to what is certainly the most famous critique of Donnellan's distinction. Later in the chapter Wettstein traces the evolving descriptions of the cognitive requirement for reference through Donnellan's work, beginning with the relatively unanalyzed notion of having in mind in "Reference and Definite Descriptions" and carrying through to the more intention-based and historically-based formulations of Donnellan's later papers. The chapter concludes with a brief but interesting appendix on the role of causation and history in the accounts of both Donnellan and Kripke.

In "Referring De Re", Tyler Burge focuses on an idea underlying Donnellan's treatment of proper names and referential uses of definite descriptions -- the idea that there are referential connections grounded in direct relations in thought between a speaker and referent. As Burge notes, Donnellan's examples of these reference-grounding connections are always perceptually grounded. But while Burge supports the idea that perception and perceptual memory yield paradigm cases of de re reference, he argues that to deal exclusively in perceptual cases is to set up too narrow a model. After surveying the relevant history from Russell, Quine, Kaplan, and his own now-authoritative work, Burge argues by way of examples for the existence of non-causal, non-empirical de re states and attitudes -- de re states and attitudes grounded in understanding rather than perception.

Burge identifies four types of cases falling under this category. First, there are cases involving certain uses of indexicals such as "I", "here", and "now" in thought. Our epistemic connections to the referents of these indexicals are neither purely descriptive nor purely perceptual, according to Burge. The second type of case involves certain reflections on one's own mental states and events. Burge claims one can have de re knowledge via understanding alone of the event of thinking a certain thought. Cases of the third sort involve de re attitudes toward future events or entities over which one has intentional control -- for example, actions one is about to perform. A final sort of case involves certain de re cognitions of abstract entities such as small natural numbers. In each type of case, Burge argues, we have cognitive representations that are sufficiently direct, not-purely-descriptive, non-inferential, etc. to count as de re, and yet they fall outside the perceptual paradigm to which Donnellan among others seemed to cling.

David Kaplan's contribution to the volume, "An Idea of Donnellan", includes a rich discussion tracing Donnellan's notion of having in mind back to its Russellian roots. The discussion here is illuminating (as Kaplan's discussions of Russell always are). The primary critical project in this work involves an extension of Donnellan's having in mind intended to account for problems surrounding "cognitive significance". The central claim is that there are, and in fact that there must be different ways of having the same individual in mind -- in Donnellan's own sense of having in mind. These ways are not descriptive and do not affect truth conditions (let alone truth values), but they can prove critical when it comes to accounting for our reasoning, our behavior as prompted by beliefs, and our successes and failures in understanding one another in communication. According to Kaplan, we cannot, for example, understand each other simply by having in mind the same individual; we must also coordinate our ways of having that individual in mind.

To be sure, this is in many ways a Fregean extension of Donnellan's notion. Kaplan makes no bones about Frege's influence here (and in fact one might think it shows up in the first sentence of the paper when Kaplan describes having in mind as an epistemic rather than a cognitive state). It is perhaps an interesting extension of Donnellan's idea for just this reason. But Kaplan makes a rather contentious claim when he asserts that there must be ways of having in mind in Donnellan's sense. Kaplan's reason for supposing this seems to rely on two ideas: first, that recognition failures are inevitable, and second, that if a thinker does have the same entity in mind twice without recognizing it, she must have the entity in mind in two different ways. Kaplan is certainly right on the first point. But it is less clear that he's right on the second. It seems recognition failures could be taken to indicate simple failures of omniscience rather than the presence of ways of having in mind. A further worry is that Donnellan's having in mind, at least on one natural reading of the notion, is an utterly direct cognitive relation that simply cannot admit of ways. If this is so, though we can talk about ways of having in mind, it cannot be Donnellan's notion of having in mind under discussion.

But whatever one thinks of Kaplan's Frege-inspired treatment of the notion, there is a second thread in the chapter of considerable interest: his discussion of the person-to-person transmission of having in mind -- with or without names. This discussion is interesting in its own right, but also bears directly on issues surrounding our thinking and speaking of historical individuals, and Kaplan uses it to uncover a critical difference between Russellian acquaintance and Donnellan's having in mind: the latter, but not the former, can be passed from one person to another.

The final contribution to the volume comes from one of its editors, Joseph Almog. In "Referential Uses and the Foundations of Direct Reference", Almog claims that it was Donnellan's work that initiated the turn toward semantic direct reference. The author calls for a "fundamental reevaluation" of the standard assessment of Donnellan (due primarily to Kripke). Almog clarifies three sometimes-missed innovations in Donnellan's work. First, Almog argues, the referential use is semantically significant, contrary to Kripke's evaluation. Second, Donnellan's critique of Frege and Russell recognized foundational differences between them -- boiling down to the critical difference between reference and denotation -- left unacknowledged by Kripke. And third, Donnellan's treatment of definite and indefinite descriptions allows for intuitive explanations of anaphoric reference to which Kripke cannot appeal. In fact, Almog claims, it is Donnellan's (and Russell's) notion of reference that "vindicates the title 'direct reference.'" Kripke's rigid designation, according to Almog, is never direct, and in virtue of this really amounts to denotation. In Almog's words, "Indirect reference is an oxymoron".

Overall, the volume contains new work on a wide variety of issues and is likely to be of interest to anyone working in the philosophy of language as well as many of those working in the philosophy of mind. The topical range of the essays reveals the philosophical range of the man who inspired them, and the collection does a beautiful job of highlighting both Donnellan's place in the philosophical history from which he emerged and his powerful influence in newly emerging work.