Having It Both Ways: Hybrid Theories and Modern Metaethics

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Guy Fletcher and Michael Ridge (eds.), Having It Both Ways: Hybrid Theories and Modern Metaethics, Oxford University Press, 2014, 302pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199347582.

Reviewed by Eric Gampel, California State University, Chico


This collection consists of previously unpublished papers by some of the main advocates and critics of a hybrid approach in metaethics. Instead of taking sides in the debate between cognitivism and expressivism, hybrid approaches combine elements of each, seeking thereby to gain the main advantages of each metaethical theory while avoiding its most serious problems. The first half of the volume offers essays that explain and defend various ways of developing a hybrid account, while the second includes essays more skeptical about whether a hybrid approach can work. Some of the essays include responses to an influential critical paper by Mark Schroeder,[1] and the last essay by Schroeder seeks to clarify his doubts about whether a hybrid approach can succeed.

Anyone interested in metaethics would benefit from this rich collection. It provides a comprehensive, midstream snapshot of a promising new approach in metaethics, and includes a helpful overview and chapter guide by the editors. The papers are the result of a conference on hybrid theories at the University of Edinburgh in 2012, so the volume provides a timely assessment of the prospects for the hybrid strategy. For those familiar with the literature, a look at the table of contents would provide a good sense of what to expect; for others, an overview of the strategy and the included essays might be in order.

As a very simple illustration of the hybrid strategy, consider the case of pejorative slurs. If I call someone a jerk, it's plausible that I have various descriptive beliefs about his character and behavior, as well as a negative attitude of some kind. A cognitivist about such pejoratives takes the core of my utterance to be an expression of my beliefs about Frank, and thus to be a claim about Frank's jerkiness, one that can be true or false, just as claims about his bachelorhood or height might be. In contrast, an expressivist takes the core to be the communication of my negative attitude about Frank; I am expressing how I feel about him. A hybrid approach sensibly embraces both: in saying 'Frank is a jerk', I am both expressing my beliefs about Frank, as well as my negative attitude. In taking this as a model for moral discourse, the hope is to use the cognitive element to make sense of how our moral language works much like ordinary descriptive language, handling embedding and the 'Frege-Geach' problem for noncognitivism, while using the expressive element to make sense of the practical import of moral language, how calling something 'bad' or 'wrong' makes a difference to how we would and should act and feel.

Sounds sensible enough. But notice that in the case of the pejorative 'jerk', it's far from clear exactly which beliefs I have about Frank in thinking him a jerk: maybe I think he mistreats his wife, or that he is overly selfish, or that he lacks sympathy for those in need. Nor is the attitude I express transparent: maybe I feel contempt for him, maybe I feel an aversion to being around him, or perhaps it's some mix of fear and disapproval. This creates problems. A cognitivist about pejoratives has to figure out some general characterization of the property of jerkiness, something shared by all and only jerks; an expressivist has to identify an attitude shared by all who are led to call someone a jerk. But why isn't it even worse for the hybrid theorist, since it would seem he has to do both?

The same apparent problems are faced by hybrid theorists about moral discourse: they owe us an account of both the cognitive and expressive aspects of moral language, and how they fit together. The challenge on the cognitive side is to avoid a nonnaturalist metaphysic, which most hybrid theorists have accomplished by developing a naturalist account of moral properties. The challenge on the expressive side is to offer a reasonably systematic account of the attitudes expressed by our various and sundry moral utterances, and explain what is going on when moral terms appear within logical and intentional contexts.

The contributions in this collection tackle these tasks in various ways. The volume opens with an essay by Michael Ridge, who defends a hybrid approach to discourse about rationality. On Ridge's view, to say that someone's action is rational is to say the action has certain properties that he spells out in detail, most centrally that the action serves the agent's ends. Ridge's account of rationality is instrumentalist, and provides the cognitive component: if I say the action is rational, I am expressing certain beliefs about the action's properties, beliefs that can be true or false, and properties that can obtain or not obtain. The noncognitive element, the one linked to attitudes of approval, is something Ridge places outside the semantic meaning expressed by claims about rationality. But he suggests that as a speech act, a claim about an action's being rational still "expresses a proattitude" (17), both because of the pragmatics of what we are normally implying in saying an act is rational, and the obvious appeal of the natural properties involved in instrumental rationality (e.g., that a rational act serves one's ends.) So Ridge's approach combines a naturalist and reductive understanding of the property of being rational, with a pragmatic account of how calling an act rational (ordinarily) counts as endorsing or approving of it in some way.

Ridge's is the only essay to discuss rationality. The rest focus on moral discourse, though some of the other advocates of a hybrid approach also rely on a distinction between semantics and pragmatics. To get a sense of the range of views on offer, consider the following list of approaches to the cognitivist element of moral discourse:

1. David Copp relies on a naturalistic realism about moral properties that he has defended elsewhere, [2] on which moral properties are natural, objective properties about which we can be mistaken (55).

2. Stephen Finlay develops and defends a relativist naturalism that ties moral judgments to each individual's informational framework (124-148).

3. John Eriksson takes moral properties to be relative to each speaker's moral standards. But he denies that such properties are what determine the truth or falsity of a moral claim, embracing instead an expressivist and minimalist approach on which to say a moral claim is true is "to do little more than to assent to it" (166).

Similar variety can be found amongst the essays on a large number of other issues, such as the aptness of the model of pejoratives for moral discourse, whether and how to account for internal ties to motivation, whether hybrid theories can successfully deal with the Frege-Geach problem, and how a hybrid theory might offer an answer to the traditional Open Question argument. The collection includes a number of quite interesting, novel proposals about how to handle these various issues. For instance, Daniel Boisvert suggests we set aside the truth-conditional as well as mentalist semantic theories used by the other contributors to the volume, adopting what he calls a "success-conditional semantics" to make sense of a hybrid approach. And Laura and François Schroeter present and develop a new theory of concepts in arguing against any hybrid approach to moral discourse.

The variety, breadth, and depth of these essays make the collection well worth exploring. Metaethics has always drawn from other areas of philosophy to make progress, and in this volume you can see that in spades. The emphasis is in using recent developments in the philosophy of language and mind to open the door to new ways of conceiving of moral discourse. It would be unreasonable to expect to find any finished hybrid theories here, as the contributors are still working out the details, but it would be even more unreasonable to ignore the progress being made.

[1] "Hybrid Expressivism: Virtues and Vices." Ethics 119 (2009): 257-309

[2] David Copp, Morality in a Natural World: Selected Essays in Metaethics. New York: Cambridge University Press (2007).