The Enduring Importance of Leo Strauss

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Laurence Lampert, The Enduring Importance of Leo Strauss, University of Chicago Press, 2013, 345pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226039480.

Reviewed by Michael P. Zuckert, University of Notre Dame


Laurence Lampert's The Enduring Importance of Leo Strauss is itself important and of lasting value, even more so than his earlier book, Leo Strauss and Nietzsche (1996). The two books share a great deal in theme and tone. In the first book, Lampert focused his attention on Strauss's one essay on Nietzsche. A common theme in both books is that Strauss has shown Nietzsche to belong to the tradition of Platonic political philosophy. The rest of the first book addresses the places of both Nietzsche and Strauss himself in "the history of Platonic political philosophy," an enterprise that led Lampert to attempt a relatively brief overview of Strauss's project with a particular emphasis on Strauss's reading of Plato's Republic. That reading, according to Lampert, brought Socrates's relation to Thrasymachus to the fore and with it the purported synthesis of the rhetorical "way of Thrasymachus" with the philosophical or dialectical "way of Socrates" to produce an amalgam, political philosophy, marked by a Nietzschean concern to rule by legislating values.

These themes are present again in the newer book, but in a much refined and more plausible form. The content of the second book is rather (though not entirely) different as well. Most of it is devoted to close readings of a number of Strauss's most important texts: his study of Jehudah Halevi's Kuzari; his study of Xenophon's Oeconomicus as presented in Xenophon's Socratic Discourse (1970), a book Strauss intimated was his best (75); Strauss's lengthy essay on Plato's Republic in his The City and Man (1964), an essay Lampert considers Strauss's "most important" (73). Lampert places his discussion of Strauss on The Republic in a chapter at the center of his own book in accord with the great importance he, following Strauss, attributes to centers. Lampert also takes on the introduction to Strauss's early work, Philosophy and Law (1935), and Strauss's most programmatic writing, the essay based on the lecture series he delivered in Jerusalem in 1954-1955, "What is Political Philosophy?"

Lampert's answer to the question his title raises is that Strauss is enduringly important because he "rediscovered the art of writing practiced by all philosophers prior to the modern Enlightenment" (1). Lampert thus focuses on that aspect of Strauss's thinking that has proven most infuriating to many of his readers: his discovery of "exoteric writing," or the outward or public presentation of their thoughts by the philosophers in texts that do not contain "the truth, the whole truth and nothing but the truth" as they (the philosophers) saw the truth. Lampert finds most valuable in Strauss, then, that aspect of philosophic writing equated by many with "noble lying." Strauss's recovery of "a forgotten kind of writing," as he called it, is valuable because it "helped make possible the new history of philosophy that recovers the genuine teaching of the greatest thinkers and poets of our tradition" (1; see also 209-210). As Lampert concludes of Strauss, "He wrote books that will endure and instruct as long as books are studied, for they give access to what endures, the history of philosophy as the written record of the great thinkers and actors most responsible for our civilization" (314).

Unlike Mark Antony, Lampert has come to praise Strauss -- but also to bury him: while Strauss has given access for the first time in a long time to the philosophic tradition as it really was, he has at the same time been left behind by philosophy. Using Strauss to understand Nietzsche correctly, Lampert sees the way forward along Nietzsche's trajectory, not Strauss's. Strauss's discovery of the practice of exoteric writing allowed him to see that "it was the necessities of exotericism, of fitting philosophy to the ruling men, that forced philosophy to adopt the different guises in different ages that made it look so different when looked back at without the resources of an appreciation of exotericism" (127). That history, when viewed without the aid of Strauss's discovery, looks to be a succession of different, warring doctrines, with no clear winner and, therefore, no clear answers to the questions philosophy poses. In the eyes of many contemporaries, the chief lesson of that history lies in the doctrine Strauss called historicism, that is, the view that philosophy or, rather, all thought, is embedded in and reflects the history in which it was produced. The history of philosophy suggests to historicists that philosophy itself is impossible, for it can never attain the truth but only some historically determined version of "truth."

With Strauss-trained eyes, Lampert finds that history to look quite different. The key to understanding the history of philosophy is the distinction between philosophy and political philosophy, a distinction Lampert purports to appropriate from Strauss, but which he significantly modifies in his usage. The history does not reveal a tableau of historically changing doctrines, but one constant esoteric doctrine held by thinkers "from Socrates to Nietzsche," that doctrine being "a shared ontology" that " recognizes the sovereignty of becoming and that can be labeled, if simplistically, a process monism" (142, 234; also see 100, 184, 238).

What gives the appearance of variety and conflict to the philosophic tradition is the supplementary fact that this "shared ontology . . . grounds philosophy's needs for a theological-political program" (142). That "theological-political program" is what one can also call philosophy's exoteric teaching or political philosophy. In other words, as Lampert has it, there is philosophy, the sincerely held and true understanding of being, and there is political philosophy, the public presentation or public face philosophy presents to the world (1). The political philosopher "arms philosophy with religion" or religion-like entities and concepts like the Platonic ideas or more broadly "the lie of the permanent and transcendent" (294, 295).

According to Lampert, then, philosophy is constant (the constant affirmation of universal flux) while political philosophy varies. The variances are due to the different clothing philosophy requires at different times and places. The philosophers are driven to become political philosophers for a variety of reasons. The philosophers are "non-self-sufficient." They must live in a society ruled by others and need to secure their own place and the freedom to philosophize. In order to secure themselves, the philosophers need to become rulers -- indirectly if not directly -- through their ability to reshape opinion. "A philosopher by the very logic of inquiry comes to recognize the need for a theological-political program [i.e., a political philosophy] to advance philosophy by reshaping the social order to philosophy's advantage" (283). Lampert can say that political philosophy follows from "the logic of inquiry" because the inquiry reveals the nature of being and of the philosopher to be "will to power." The philosopher shares this imperative of power-seeking and thus seeks to rule via legislating for society. Such ruling activity is not only logical but just, for the philosopher deserves to rule on the basis of superior wisdom and ability to benefit the non-philosophers. Some of these Lampertian conclusions clearly run counter to very explicit claims raised by Strauss, in particular his claim that the philosophers do not seek to rule. But Lampert counters that objection by maintaining that Strauss, too, writes exoterically. The shrinking philosopher is part of the exoteric doctrine: Strauss is much more like Nietzsche than he openly admits.

On the basis of his claims about the relation between philosophy and political philosophy, Lampert develops a comprehensive outline of the history of philosophy heretofore. Socratic philosophy, as carried on by Xenophon, Plato, and Aristotle, arose in a time of great crisis for the Greeks: it was "the time of the death of the Homeric gods." This crisis led the Socratics to establish substitutes that met the needs of the Greek gentlemanly class -- "teleotheology" as in Xenophon, the theory of ideas as in Plato, the doctrine of final and formal causes as in Aristotle. Rational and benevolent, eternal and splendid entities and principles replace the gods (97-98, 147). All that the standard histories of philosophy consider to be the considered views of the philosophers are merely their exoteric teachings. "Ancient philosophers beginning with Socrates acted to provide a ministerial poetry [= political philosophy] favorable to philosophy: they undertook a 'project' that came to have world-historical dimension" (155). That project suited the dying pagan world, but required serious modification with the rise of the monotheistic religions.

Medieval Platonic political philosophers . . . -- understanding the spiritual situation of their time to be an association of believers subject to the agents of the Universal God everyone knew to be the only God -- endorsed that God as the most muscular defender of the moral law and found a way to provide a hidden place for philosophy within that already existing 'Platonic' system." (155).

But the reign of the monotheistic God led to a crisis within the Christian part of His realm, and that required yet another change in political philosophy. "Early modern Platonic political philosophers, understanding the spiritual situation of their time to be a crisis . . . that threatened philosophy itself, constructed a new" political philosophy "informed by the new science of nature" (155). The early moderns, Lampert maintains, were genuine Platonic political philosophers. He argues that Strauss's apparent hostility to the moderns was chiefly rhetorical (see 107, 154-5, 187, 223, 283, 286). The ancient-modern divide is a prominent feature of Strauss's own exoteric doctrine.

Lampert reads Nietzsche as a Platonic philosopher of the same sort -- responding to the "crisis of nihilism brought on by the collapse of Platonism" he developed "a theological-political program that is an approximation of the truth fit for the times" (155). Thus, for Nietzsche the doctrine of will to power is philosophy, the truth about being, and the doctrine of eternal return, reasonably "understood as the highest value grounded on that fact" is political philosophy (222). In this case, however, the political philosophy does not rest on fictions, as in all previous forms of Platonism, but on the truth. According to Lampert, Strauss brought out this crucial structure of Nietzsche's thought in his very late essay on Beyond Good and Evil. Strauss's essay is "a milestone in Nietzsche studies, recovery of the genuine philosopher Nietzsche by the greatest reader of the twentieth century" (269). This "recovery" is not only a severing of Nietzsche from "the dominant interpretations," but also "from his own earlier judgments against" Nietzsche (269). That is to say, Strauss had regularly denounced Nietzsche in his earlier writings as the manifestation of the crisis of modernity, but, Lampert argues, in the 1972 essay Strauss uncovered a new Nietzsche not subject to his own earlier (mistaken) denunciations.

Lampert's argument raises an interesting question he does not himself pursue: if Strauss had recognized the "true Nietzsche" earlier, would he have modified his explicit position on ancients and moderns and his characteristic call for "return to the ancients"? Since Strauss's Nietzsche essay was completed only one year before his death, he certainly had no opportunity to reconfigure his political philosophy in such a radical way. Whether Strauss would have modified his position or not, Lampert thinks he should have. This is where Lampert breaks with Strauss and follows Nietzsche, though again, a Nietzsche illuminated by Strauss. At bottom Lampert thinks the basic or important disagreement between Strauss and Nietzsche stemmed from their different assessments of "the spiritual needs" of the dawning age of nihilism.

For Strauss, the answer was "return" -- a recurrence to Platonic political philosophy in more or less its original form. This means keeping to the "lies" about the eternal and publically suppressing or ignoring the truth about nature. For Lampert and his Nietzsche the answer lies in forging ahead with the Enlightenment experiment of attempting an experiment with truth, i.e., basing society on the truth of flux or will to power as the being of the beings (e.g., 262). Advances in our knowledge of nature have made a Socratic teleotheology, as well as the biblical God, no longer serviceable: as Nietzsche proclaimed "God is dead" -- as are all his "shadows." The crisis of nihilism presents a greater challenge -- and also an opportunity -- for truth to truly rule and for humanity to benefit from that liberation from error and false constraint. But as Lampert, following Nietzsche, concedes, such an "experiment" was novel, and Strauss, though aware of the Nietzschean possibility, holds back out of caution. In his philosophy Strauss agrees with Nietzsche, but in political philosophy he is timid -- a "deer" Lampert calls him (273n.). Because he favors the Nietzschean rather than the Straussian path, Lampert can reveal what Strauss took pains to conceal beneath his exotericism -- the truth about nature and about Strauss's own thinking.

After Nietzsche, because of Nietzsche, different scruples apply to those aiming to recover the true history of philosophy. Nietzsche spoke so . . . openly . . . of what a philosopher is in order to have philosophy assume its rightful role in advancing the modern enlightenment and its experiment of founding society on the truth. Adopting Nietzsche's perspective . . . I will scrupulously expose Strauss's somewhat veiled or exoteric arguments as openly as I can. (72)

As should be clear to all those interested even a little in Strauss (or Nietzsche), Lampert has written a stimulating, provocative, even in places exhilarating book. He combines often meticulous readings of some of Strauss's most important works, readings that any reader is sure to find informative, with the larger narrative of Strauss's political philosophic project and its limits as sketched above. This is surely one of the most comprehensive attempts to get hold of Strauss's thinking as a coherent whole. Whether, after proper study and reflection, one agrees or not with Lampert's version of Strauss, his book surely furthers the on-going effort on the part of many to come to grips with Strauss.

There are many issues such a reflective grappling with Lampert would need to consider. Three of the leading issues are (to use Lampert's terminology): Is he correct about Strauss's philosophy? About his political philosophy? About the relation between philosophy and political philosophy? A proper treatment of those three issues would require a book of the length and scope of Lampert's own, but let me say a few words of doubt about Lampert's presentation of each of the three -- in reverse order.

When Lampert speaks of philosophy and political philosophy as he does, he has some warrant in Strauss for doing so. In an important essay, "On Classical Political Philosophy," Strauss had said that

the adjective 'political' in the expression 'political philosophy' designates not so much a subject matter as a manner of treatment . . . . 'political philosophy' means primarily not the philosophic treatment of politics, but the political, or popular, treatment of philosophy, or the political introduction to philosophy" (What is Political Philosophy?, 93-94).

Although not really the same as Lampert's presentation, this formulation gives some basis for his way of relating philosophy and political philosophy. But this is not Strauss's most revealing statement about political philosophy. In his The City and Man Strauss put the matter thus: "in its original [Socratic] form political philosophy broadly understood is the core of philosophy or rather 'the first philosophy'" (City and Man, 20). That "original" understanding of political philosophy is a result of the Socratic second sailing described in Plato's Phaedo, according to which Socrates redirects his attention from the direct study of nature to the indirect study via the examination of opinions. Accordingly, Strauss affirms against the scientific approach to politics the notion that all "science" must root in and remain in touch with "common sense." That approach to philosophy as a whole is what Strauss means by political philosophy in the classical sense. Thus, Strauss does not relate philosophy to political philosophy in the manner of Lampert, where philosophy precedes and "lays the foundations" for political philosophy. Quite the reverse.

Moreover, Strauss's overt or explicit presentation of his political philosophy is quite different from Lampert's version of it. According to Lampert, Strauss's political philosophy is the original Socratic-Platonic-Xenophontic exoteric theological-political program (or perhaps some sort of blend of that with the medieval version). But Lampert does not give the weight required to Strauss's explicit exposé of the esoteric Socratic-Platonic-Xenophontic doctrine, as in his rejection of the Platonic ideas, his explicit questioning of the notion of moral virtue, his expressed doubts about ancient cosmology. In a word, Strauss's political philosophy is very different, very stripped down, as it were, from the exoteric classical political philosophy.

Finally, Lampert finds Strauss's philosophy and Nietzsche's to be identical, the affirmation (in short-hand) of universal flux. Strauss affirms eros to be the "being of beings": "Eros, we can say, is the heart of coming into being and perishing. Eros, we can say, is the nature of nature, the essence of nature" (142). Lampert identifies eros with will to power. But Strauss was always at pains to distinguish eros from will to power. As Strauss said in a lecture on Socrates delivered in 1970, i.e., very late in his career and at almost the same time as his Nietzsche essay, "Nietzsche replaces eros by the will to power -- a striving which has a goal by a striving which has no such goal." This replacement, Strauss says, reveals "the serious opposition of Nietzsche to Socrates" ("Problem of Socrates," Interpretation 22(3), 324) (emphasis added; see also Strauss's essay on Nietzsche, 176 in Studies in Platonic Political Philosophy). Lampert dismisses the affirmation of eros as object-directed as Strauss's lingering original Platonism, but in actual meaning, he thinks, Straus sees eros to be just the same as will to power. But eros, according to Strauss, is a striving for an object, for the good, which he understands to be the good of the truth or an expression of "love of the truth that is independent of will or decision" (176). Lampert assimilates Strauss and Nietzsche at the level of philosophy because he does not take sufficient account of Strauss's beautiful words in his essay on liberal education: "By becoming aware of the dignity of the mind, one realizes the true ground of the dignity of man and therewith the goodness of the world . . . which is the home of man because it is the home of the human mind." To appreciate this claim by Strauss one must approach him not via Nietzsche, as Lampert does, but through Husserl and Heidegger as pointing toward the Socratic "way of opinion" that Strauss affirms.