The Feeling Body: Affective Science Meets the Enactive Mind

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Giovanna Colombetti, The Feeling Body: Affective Science Meets the Enactive Mind, MIT Press, 2014, 270pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262019958.

Reviewed by Craig DeLancey, State University of New York at Oswego


This book aims to develop an enactivist view of affects, with special attention to the emotions. Enactivism, for those unfamiliar with the term, is a movement in the philosophy of mind and in psychology whose proponents argue that we should understand mental faculties as essentially related to the extended body and to action. It has an ancestry that includes ecological psychology and existential phenomenology. Giovanna Colombetti hearkens back to the views of Francisco Varela and Evan Thompson as principal forebears, along with much of the phenomenological tradition and the dynamicists. Enactivist work on perception has proved very promising and provocative; extending the approach to affects is a natural goal.

The book can be roughly sorted into two parts. The first outlines the enactivist view as Colombetti understands it, and applies this to the notion of basic emotions and appraisal. The second half is a mix of phenomenology and discussion of the role and method of phenomenology as a tool to study affects.

For Colombetti, enactivism is founded on a view of organisms as autonomous and purposeful, and the capabilities of these organisms are best described by dynamical systems theory. The preferred terminology in this discussion is, at least for me, confusing. From Varela and forebears such as Jakob von Uexküll, we learn that all organisms are cognitive, sense-making, "enact a meaningful world," make implicit inferences, assess and appreciate, and have "concerns." The view being espoused is one familiar to those who have looked into the debate on teleofunctions. Organisms have purposes, and their actions can be interpreted in light of these purposes; when these purposes are inherited, we can interpret some of the organism's inherited structures in terms of these purposes. What the enactivist tradition adds is that we should interpret the world as encountered by the organism in terms of these purposes. This is all very reasonable and helpful. What is perplexing is why we need to use the kind of rich semantic terminology we expect of a cognitive psychologist studying humans, and then apply that terminology to bacteria, molds, and sponges. It invites misunderstanding. But, that said, Colombetti inherits this terminology, and perhaps one must continue to use it to be able to talk with this tradition.

Colombetti applies the enactivist perspective to emotions by way of assessing the debate about basic emotions and affect programs, together called BET. Her criticism of BET is that it fosters an expectation that there are only a handful of pancultural emotions. This criticism has two aspects. One is that there could be other pancultural emotions. I am not sure that this addresses BET directly. Principal motives for BET are to develop an alternative to social contructionism about emotions, to develop an alternative to the (once) rampant and very strong forms of reductive cognitivism about emotions, and to take an evolutionary perspective on emotions. I think that most defenders of BET would be delighted to learn there were other pancultural emotions. BET defenders stick to the few stalwart examples (like fear) because they are trying to make a point and don't want to get drawn into an argument about whether, say, nostalgia is a pancultural emotion. The other aspect of Colombetti's criticism has more force: it is that there may be fluid boundaries or edges to these basic emotions, and perhaps some BET defenders neglect this possibility (although, it must be said, no textual evidence is cited to show that BET defenders have this vice).

Adopting a dynamical systems terminology, Colombetti concludes that

from a dynamical systems perspective, emotional episodes correspond to specific self-organizing forms or second-order constraints -- emotion forms, as I call them -- that recruit or entrain various processes (neural, muscular, autonomic, etc.) into highly integrated configurations or patterns. (69)

Colombetti's task in this part of the book is to answer the question "what is the best way to conceptualize the emotions?" (58). (Unfortunately, sometimes conceptualization sounds like the provision of lists. For example, we are told that dynamical systems theories "characterize the organism as complex, self-organizing, open, and plastic, realizing emotional episodes that are softly assembled, context dependent, and highly variable, yet patterned and recurrent" (58).) Given this description of emotional episodes, one might wish that it were easier to draw a prediction that would distinguish this enactivist view from other kinds of views. Those developing enactivism regarding perception are able to offer predictions. For example, the enactivist view that vision is essentially a form of interaction with the environment predicts that sensory substitution should be possible: we should be able to make some other sense become (to some degree) like vision if we can make it interact in similar ways with the environment and with action. Research is being done to test such predictions. But I am unable to think of a way to test how Colombetti's enactivist view of emotion would differ from BET. I suspect that every defender of BET would gladly assent to Colombetti's description of emotional episodes.

Colombetti's view of appraisal is that it is far more fundamental than is allowed in the classic literature on appraisal in the study of emotion. It is not uncommon to adopt a bivalent view of appraisal in psychology: subjects are supposedly always making a judgment of good or bad, or all emotions can be sorted into positive or negative, and so on. Drawing on the view of organisms as inherently purposeful, Colombetti argues we can think of the fundamental purposes of organisms as constituting perception and action. These in turn shape a varied and complex array of possible kinds of appraisals. Colombetti's assessment of contemporary appraisal theory, and her alternative to it, are highly plausible. Furthermore, they cohere well with an enriched evolutionary perspective: organisms don't inherit a world full of merely good and bad things. They inherit a world where there are many ways to interact with the environment. (One is tempted to say, they inherit many affordances.) Given the relatively simplistic views of appraisal and motivation typical in philosophy and some psychology, this is an area where continued research is needed and helpful.

The phenomenological considerations in the latter half of the book combine proposals for methods and a review of some relevant phenomenological research.

The methodological suggestions are for the adoption of first and second person methods for a "neuro-physio-phenomenology." Colombetti argues that we have neglected first person methods, and that these can be developed and properly managed when combined with second and third person methods. Here, second person methods are the interaction between the subject doing the first person research, and a specialist who asks questions to guide that research. Third person research will be scientific investigations, such as fMRI studies, correlated with the first and second person results.

Attempting these methods would be difficult but worthwhile. Given that "feeling" has always had a contentious but important role in our understanding of affects, the study of affects is in the same position as the study of consciousness: we wish we could learn more about first person experience and find a shared terminology to discuss what we learn. Those who are skeptical about Colombetti's proposal will no doubt want to see the methods tested, so ideally there should be consensus on pursuing such a course in a trial way. One significant challenge will be to understand how these methods will control for bias. The second person investigation is supposed to eschew scripts. Colombetti argues that second person investigators should use a "semi-structured" interview to talk with the first person investigator, in which the interviewer is "guided by" a schedule of questions, but "need not follow it strictly and need not ask the same questions in all interviews" (152). The use of open-ended questions is presumably meant to avoid bias. But surely open-ended questions can lead to biased results. A thousand cues can be sent from the interviewer to the interviewee, perhaps unconscious to both of them, that encourage an outcome favorable to our hypothesis. Questions that lead to unfavorable results can start to seem less important for the interviews, and end up being the questions that "need not" be asked in all interviews. Questions that lead to favorable results can start to seem very productive, and end up being asked in all interviews. And so on. We need more explanation of how bias would be handled in both the second and first person investigations. For example, would it be possible or practical to have first and second person investigators who are isolated from the hypothesis, and isolated from any theory relevant to the research being undertaken?

Colombetti's applications of phenomenological insights address the experience of the body and our experience of the emotions of others.

The felt experience of the body has been a contentious issue in the study of emotion at least since the work of William James. Colombetti argues that we have a constant and nuanced experience of the body at all times, and offers some taxonomic distinctions between the ways in which we experience the body. Foremost of these is an idea that we can experience the body as "foreground," in which the subject is well aware of the body experience; or as "background," where the body experiences are ignored. In neither case is the body necessarily the (direct or primary) object of one's thoughts. The primary point of the phenomenological exercise is to argue that we have a very complex experience of the body.

Regarding observed emotional episodes in others, Colombetti argues for a direct realism, in which we directly "perceive" the emotions of those who are having an emotion episode. This is proposed as an alternative to simulation theory and theory theory views of understanding others. Instead of inferring their emotions, or simulating them, we empathize directly. Simulation theorists will likely insist that this view is fully consistent with their own. Given that we sometimes can be mistaken, or that emotions can be faked, then it cannot be strictly true that we directly perceive the emotion; rather, we empathize in a reliable way. But Colombetti's alternative to simulation theory differs in its stress on the abilities underlying empathy. The enactive view of empathy is much less cognitive (as "cognitive" is used in contemporary psychology) than in (most) simulation theories: it is a view of empathy as relying on a collection of primitive and automatic abilities to mirror and mimic the other, which perhaps need not be coordinated into a coherent whole. The simulation theorists will need to tell us whether they are willing to call the exercise of these kinds of abilities a "simulation."

There is a struggle in the philosophy of mind that is as fundamental as the divide between empiricists and rationalists in epistemology: a tension over whether our models of mind should pull in the direction of computational manipulations of representations, which tend to be discrete, isolated, and independent; or whether our models of mind should push "outward" as much as possible, eschewing representation for interaction, the discrete for the continuous, the isolated for the entrained. Of course, only a few philosophers of mind would accept a view of mind at either extreme. We all know that all brains states are influenced by other brain states and shaped dynamically by development, learning, and the environment. Most of us also believe that there are representations -- which, if not discrete, are seemingly discrete and often act as if they were discrete -- and these representations need to be explained. Nonetheless, there is much disagreement between, and even more distinction in the methods and assumptions of, the two approaches. The dialogue between these approaches is productive. It exposes prejudices and forces us to rethink our theories in light of fundamentally diverse perspectives. Colombetti's book is a valuable contribution to this dialogue, a first sustained argument for enactivism as a unified and coherent understanding of the affects.