The Good Life: Unifying the Philosophy and Psychology of Well-Being

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Michael A. Bishop, The Good Life: Unifying the Philosophy and Psychology of Well-Being, Oxford University Press, 2015, 235pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199923113.

Reviewed by Dan Haybron, Saint Louis University


We're going to need a bigger taxonomy. At least, that's how it looks to this reviewer. For a very long time, the Western philosophical literature on well-being chugged along with a reasonably familiar menu of options: in the most familiar telling (Parfit 1984), hedonism, desire theories, and "objective list" theories. We might quibble with certain details of this reckoning, but however we want to divide things up, the debates about well-being have continued to center on more or less the same basic theoretical options. Then L.W. Sumner tossed a wrench in the works with his influential "authentic happiness" account (1996), which does not fit readily into any of the standard classificatory schemes. There have been other interesting developments since then, but perhaps the most significant addition to the philosophical bestiary is Michael A. Bishop's network theory of well-being, which he defends in this important new book.

The network theory, which Bishop introduced in a recent paper (2012), identifies well-being with instantiating a self-sustaining network of positive feelings, attitudes, behaviors, traits and accomplishments: a positive causal network. When doing well, you are embedded in a self-reinforcing web of positive internal and external states and events; when doing badly, you are caught in a "rut" or "vicious cycle" of negative interactions. It may take some time for philosophers to digest the novelty of this approach. But it seems to me one of the most important advances in the field for some decades, and I suspect our ways of classifying theories of well-being will need to change to accommodate it.

This is a marvelous book, made all the more so by its plain-spoken, good humored and concise exposition. Bishop focuses on the big picture, building his case where argument is most needed and trusting readers to sort out the quibbles that can often make philosophy books a bit of a slog. Even those unpersuaded of Bishop's theory will find much to like and learn from. Among other things, he offers a helpful guide to recent empirical work on well-being, as well as a fruitful theoretical framework for thinking about how human well-being works in practice. I expect philosophers with a wide range of theoretical commitments -- hedonists, desire theorists and Aristotelians alike -- will make use of the ideas in this volume. It is also easy to imagine psychologists deploying the essentials of the network theory in their research, whether or not they accept it as an account of well-being. If there is one philosophical book on well-being that empirical researchers should read, it is probably this.

The book starts with a brief chapter summarizing the network theory, on which "the state of well-being is the state of being in (or, to use philosopher's jargon, instantiating) a positive causal network," or PCN (10). It is, in other words, "to be 'stuck' in a self-perpetuating cycle of positive emotions, positive attitudes, positive traits, and successful engagement with the world" (8). Success at work, for instance, fosters happiness, which in turn promotes further good outcomes at work. When things are genuinely going well, it isn't just a bunch of nice stuff happening, with no particular connections among them; rather, you are in a kind of "groove," where the good things in your life are mutually reinforcing.

A person's well-being, then, is a holistically-defined affair having to do with the state of the person-life system as a whole. To understand the contribution of particular items to well-being, such as a backrub, as well as of varying degrees of well-being, we need the notion of a PCN fragment. Bishop defines a PCN fragment as a state or set of states that "could be a significant link in a positive causal network for that person, keeping relatively constant the sort of person he is (i.e., his personality, his goals and his general dispositions)" (11). The particular good things in our lives -- enjoyments, successes, attitudes, etc. -- benefit us by being or contributing to PCN fragments: they play, or are apt to play, a positive causal role in our lives, which is to say they tend toward the establishment or enhancement of PCNs. We can, then, characterize the degree of well-being a person has by "(a) the strength of her positive causal network and (b) the strength of her positive causal network fragments" (12). The strength of a PCN, in turn, is a matter of how robust it is.

The idea of a positive causal network is consistent with any theory of well-being (and hence of interest independently of such theories): the desire theorist, for instance, can emphasize the importance of positive causal networks for getting what you want. To see the appeal of the network theory as an account of well-being, it may be helpful to consider a stronger set of empirical assumptions than Bishop himself makes. Suppose you think that human welfare generally has the sort of holistic structure that is characteristic of PCNs: from the perspective of prudential value, human functioning isn't fragmented or chaotic but much more web-like, and standardly involves a more or less coherent, self-reinforcing causal system in which one's feelings, attitudes, behaviors, traits, and accomplishments feed into one another, tending at any given point in one's life to maintain a certain homeostasis -- be it positive, negative, or somewhere in between. Of course that equilibrium state can change -- a layoff, a death in the family, taking up meditation, . . . But the tendency will be to hover around that equilibrium.

If this picture of human functioning is correct, then a natural question is, "why not identify well-being with the state of the system itself?" For we would arguably be looking at a natural kind -- a homeostatic property cluster, in Bishop's terms (following Richard Boyd, though I don't believe Bishop uses the phrase 'natural kind' or is committed to any particular metaphysics of natural kinds). Moreover, this kind is remarkably coextensive with both commonsense and philosophical judgments about the contours of human flourishing: as a general rule, the people who are typically deemed to be thriving do seem to be embedded in positive causal networks, while the languishing appear to be stuck in negative ones. It seems, on these suppositions, that nature has given us a genuine kind that is roughly coextensive with well-being as judged by the many and the wise. One could be forgiven for imagining that the name of this kind is 'well-being'. Well-being isn't just one component of a positive causal network, such as pleasure, desire-fulfillment, or virtuous activity. Well-being is the network itself. Ecce felicitas.

The suppositions of the last two paragraphs appear to be stronger than Bishop's own; he seems committed only to the idea that the condition of well-being, or being in a PCN, is a homeostatic property cluster and presumably also to the claim that ill-being (at least often) takes this form. This is consistent with there being a large middle ground between well-being and ill-being in which one possesses various positive and negative causal network "fragments" that don't add up to a particularly unified system, as when someone enjoys workplace success while the home front suffers from neglect (though perhaps even this example tends to involve more unity than one might think). Bishop seems to think that this is in fact the case (57). So Bishop is not claiming that human functioning generally involves the sort of holistic unity posited above; only that it does when we enjoy well-being (and perhaps ill-being).

This makes the view significantly easier to defend from an empirical standpoint: it seems at least arguable that the best and worst lives do indeed involve positive causal networks, whereas it is less clear that the workaday middling-ness that seems to characterize most lives possesses that kind of causal unity. But there's a tradeoff: the more we back off from the idea that human functioning standardly involves coherent causal syndromes of the sort Bishop posits for the thriving and the languishing, the less empirically vulnerable the network view becomes; but so too does it become less compelling as an account of well-being. It is important for Bishop's project, I think, that human welfare not typically be extremely fragmented -- just "one damned thing after another," as a certain view of history goes. Otherwise it may be inapt to think of human welfare in terms of causal networks. This is not an objection, note, to Bishop's view, as I think the evidence he amasses pretty well rules out the extreme fragmentation hypothesis; indeed, perhaps the strong unity view sketched above will prove correct. The point of these reflections is to highlight both the attractions of his account and one of the points where it may be vulnerable, depending on how the empirical story plays out.

The second chapter lays out the methodology behind Bishop's view of well-being, the "inclusive approach" to the study of well-being. The inclusive approach arrives at a theory of well-being via inference to the best explanation, drawing on two sorts of data: commonsense judgments and empirical research (with philosophical theorizing serving as a stand-in for commonsense). That is, "we figure out what well-being is by identifying the item in the world that makes sense of the science of well-being and that makes most of our commonsense judgments about well-being true" (208). Traditional philosophical methods, Bishop notes, get hung up on the diversity of people's intuitions, resulting in stalemate. The inclusive approach is meant to move the debate forward by bringing empirical research into the mix, and Bishop's heavy reliance on such data to build his case is unusual. The thought is that, "by flooding the evidential base with scientific findings, the inclusive approach provides a robust fund of evidence that might favor certain commonsense judgments over others" (30). Empirically-minded philosophers have sometimes -- though less often than is commonly supposed -- tended to be dismissive of commonsense intuitions. But Bishop takes those intuitions seriously: it is crucial to his argument that the network theory not only accounts for the scientific findings but also accords reasonably well with commonsense and that it helps explain why traditional philosophical theories have seemed plausible to so many. Hence the name "inclusive" approach. While I note some concerns about the specifics of Bishop's version of the inclusive methodology below, the basic idea of this approach is highly appealing: it enriches the evidence base for philosophical debate while giving commonsense sufficient due that there is little risk of yielding a theory we cannot live with. The book seems to me a model of empirically-oriented philosophy.

The inclusive approach and the network theory constitute two of the book's main foci. Chapters Three and Four explore the third: the claim that positive psychology -- the science of well-being -- is "the study of the structure and dynamics of PCNs" (105). These chapters also develop the network theory in greater detail. Bishop observes that positive psychologists themselves have a hard time defining their field, and definitions are many and varied. The argument is that the network theory provides a unified explanation for what positive psychologists are studying, and Bishop surveys a wide range of results, for instance about friendship or creativity and well-being, to make his case. The claim that positive psychology studies PCNs is somewhat independent of the network theory of well-being, though they are mutually supporting. Some readers may be attracted to it even if they reject the network theory, or alternatively might endorse the network theory but not Bishop's view of positive psychology.

The account of well-being returns to the fore in Chapter Five, which defends it against several competitors: hedonism, informed desire theory, the authentic happiness view, and Aristotelian theories. Bishop's strategy is to "battle to a draw on common sense and win on the science. The network theory explains our commonsense judgments well enough to not be disqualified and it is so superior to its competitors at explaining the scientific evidence that it carries the day" (108). Bishop grants that the network theory has some counterintuitive implications -- but so too do all the alternatives, and it is not clearly in worse shape on this count than the other theories. Like the others, it can explain most of our intuitive judgments about well-being and is not wildly at variance with them. Hedonism, for instance, notoriously has intuitive difficulties like dealing with experience machine cases, but also errs on the empirical front by focusing narrowly on just one aspect of positive human functioning. Positive psychology is not solely concerned with hedonic states.

Chapter Six employs the network theory to address a number of difficulties in positive psychology, including uncertainty about the nature of happiness and puzzles about hedonic adaptation and set points, which have led some to doubt whether we can meaningfully promote happiness in policy and elsewhere. The gist of the chapter is that the network theory offers resources to help address these issues.

Chapter Seven, the last substantive one, rebuts objections to the network theory, including some putative counterexamples and questions about how far Bishop's view accounts for the normativity of well-being. I suspect that the most significant objections going forward will have to do with issues relating to normativity. One problem here is that there doesn't seem to be a lot of agreement about what normativity amounts to, making it hard to know what would constitute a successful rebuttal. Bishop canvasses several possible understandings of normativity and argues that either the normativity demand is unreasonable or at least overly controversial, or the network theory meets it. This is probably the best way to deal with such an elusive objection, but there will likely be residual questions about whether he has considered the right form of the normativity worry.

One kind of normativity concern has to do with how Bishop defends the network theory: it beats the competition, not because it strikes us as more plausible on reflection, but because it better explains scientific evidence and practice. And now the question arises: why should we care about that? A theory of well-being is widely thought to be in the business of telling us what is worth having in life, for our sakes, or what we ought to want for each other. Whatever exactly normativity amounts to, it seems to involve there being reasons for us to do this or want that. On the traditional approach in philosophy, we can typically grasp the putative normative credentials of a theory because the argument for it appeals in one way or another to the idea that, on reflection, it seems plausible that the theory captures what really matters in human life. The argument appeals to our sense of what's worth wanting, so we're not likely to be left wondering why we should care about the result. The hedonist, for instance, might note how obvious it is that pleasure matters for well-being, while it is not so obvious that anything else has quite the same status. On Bishop's inclusive approach, by contrast, the clincher has no obvious connection with what we think important: what favors the theory over Aristotelian theories, given that both views accord reasonably well with commonsense, is that it better explains the results and practice of positive psychology. And it isn't so clear why we ought to seek that for our children rather than, say, Aristotelian flourishing. Put another way: if you find Aristotle's theory of well-being compelling, why should the putative fact that positive psychologists study positive causal networks, which in turn provide a good explanation of their results, compel you to value those instead?

Bishop might reply: because we are already care about positive causal networks; if we didn't, then 'well-being' wouldn't refer to them. What the scientific evidence gives us is simply a clearer picture of the nature of something we already value. People care about something we call 'well-being'; the network theory just tells us what that is, and our caring about it supplies all the normativity we can reasonably demand. However, part of the worry is that it seems desirable for a theory of well-being to explain why we are right to care about it, making sense of the concern we have for it. In fairness, Bishop might reasonably ask just what manner of explanation do we seek? In general, he challenges the normativity complainant to cough up a persuasive story about what exactly normativity amounts to, a question on which the literature has been notoriously obscure and slippery. There's an itch, to be sure; the trick is figuring out exactly where it is, and whether anyone is really in a position to scratch it.

As I noted above, the book has a great deal to offer even to those who don't accept Bishop's theory of well-being. To mention just a single example, one area where the network theory could prove fruitful is in thinking about the psychological state of happiness. One problem for affect-based views of happiness, such as hedonism or the emotional state theory, is figuring out how happy you have to be to count as happy: what balance of positive versus negative affect is needed (Haybron 2008)? The traditional view, that you're happy as long as the positive outweighs the negative, is deeply implausible. Given that the great majority of individuals seem to meet that standard, it makes unhappiness exceedingly rare, and at any rate such a modest cutoff seems to make little sense on reflection -- you're happy so long as the pleasure just barely outweighs the suffering? But what would a more plausible threshold look like? Suppose Bishop is right that there is some (broad and vague) threshold at which a person enters into a positive causal network -- "a self-maintaining, homeostatic causal network" that is positive (57). As noted above, this might be evidence for the network theory, and that well-being is in some sense a natural kind. Even if not, it may well be evidence for some sort of natural kind that is strongly associated with well-being. And the character of that kind might point us to a plausible answer to the threshold problem regarding happiness: perhaps one counts as happy insofar as one exhibits an emotional or hedonic profile that is characteristic of being in a PCN. In that event, nature might have supplied us with a principled answer to the threshold problem for happiness. Happiness, on such a view, would be the emotional or hedonic condition that typically accompanies broadly positive functioning for human beings: good relationships, success in one's endeavors and fulfilling one's values, doing well by the standards of one's culture, etc. If this is right, then it makes sense of why people should take such a keen interest in happiness: not only is it pleasant, but it also tends to signify that things are going well in one's life and so is a useful indicator of overall well-being. This is of course a speculative suggestion, but it helps to illustrate how generative the network theory can be as a framework for thinking about well-being.

This is a wonderful book, and I heartily recommend it for anyone interested in the philosophy or science of well-being.


Bishop, M. (2012). "The Network Theory of Well-Being: An Introduction." The Baltic International Yearbook of Cognition, Logic and Communication, 7(0).

Haybron, D.M. (2008). The Pursuit of Unhappiness: The Elusive Psychology of Well-Being. New York: Oxford University Press.

Parfit, D. (1984). Reasons and Persons, New York: Oxford.

Sumner, L. W. (1996). Welfare, Happiness, and Ethics. New York: Oxford.