The Oxford Handbook of Philosophy of Criminal Law

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John Deigh and David Dolinko (eds.), The Oxford Handbook of Philosophy of Criminal Law, Oxford University Press, 2011, 544pp., ISBN 9780195314854.

Reviewed by Michelle Madden Dempsey, Villanova University School of Law


Over the last twenty years, the philosophy of criminal law has grown tremendously, resulting in a body of literature that reaches well beyond traditional philosophical concerns regarding punishment. Much of this burgeoning literature has focused upon the so-called "general part" of criminal law, concerning issues that apply more or less to all crimes -- such as the principles and doctrines regarding acts and omissions, attempts, causation, mens rea, and defenses. Somewhat less prominently, but just as importantly, a considerable amount of literature has concerned itself with specific offenses -- such as blackmail, rape, prostitution, hate crimes, and obscenity. Given the densely populated and complex landscape of this flourishing field, a comprehensive survey is undoubtedly called for. Deigh and Dolinko's excellent book answers that call with seventeen new essays concerning the intersection of criminal law and philosophy, authored by many of the most insightful and influential thinkers in the field.

The methodological orientation adopted by the contributing authors is relatively uniform -- so much so that the book might more accurately have been entitled, "The Oxford Handbook of the Analytic Philosophy of Criminal Law" (but then, it is the Oxford Handbook, so perhaps that goes without saying). Nearly without exception, the authors' stated aims are to clarify the issues, principally by drawing conceptual distinctions to eliminate vagueness and confusion regarding the particular areas of criminal law under consideration. On that score, the book is a tremendous success and will undoubtedly serve as a standard source for clear thinking about criminal law and philosophy for generations.

Despite the substantive strengths of the individual contributions, there is marked lack of consistency in the form and detail of the essays. At one extreme, Gerald Dworkin's fourteen page contribution on the limits of criminal law errs somewhat on the short side, omitting some of the background to these debates that would enable a student reader to set the literature in context, and failing to provide citations to a number of pieces of literature discussed in the chapter. Yet if Dworkin's contribution was written in the style of brief musings, Mitch Berman's and Marcia Baron's chapters provide stark contrast -- checking in at roughly 70 pages each, with 163 and 206 footnotes respectively. The variation between essays, while not detracting from the quality of the contributions individually, makes the volume somewhat less attractive for use as the core text in a course on criminal law philosophy. Still, many of the individual essays would serve as valuable contributions to such a course, either in terms of setting out the standard framework of current thought on the topic or moving existing debates forward.

Given the word limitations, in what follows I will comment briefly on each essay and save detailed reflections for only a few.

Gerald Dworkin's "The Limits of the Criminal Law" provides a general overview of traditional approaches to the topic, such as those offered by Mill, Devlin, and Feinberg, and compares them to the approaches taken in more recent work, including his own canonical contributions to the literature. Rather than merely reiterating his own previous work or offering yet another competing theory in an already crowded field, Dworkin offers a survey of competing methodologies concerning the investigation of criminal law's limits. Dworkin's insightful survey provides an intriguing start to this collection of essays, and will prove especially helpful to younger scholars seeking to clarify their own methodological approach to thinking about the moral limits of the criminal law.

Sticking with the theme of the moral limits of the criminal law, Larry Sumner's "Criminalizing Expression: Hate Speech and Obscenity" takes up the question of "when, if ever, is the harm caused or threatened by expression serious enough to warrant control by means of criminal sanctions?" (17) Focusing in detail on the approach adopted in Canadian law, Sumner offers a detailed and compelling argument that "the focus on the erotic, which is the hallmark of an obscenity law, may be fundamentally misdirected" and that a more appropriate vehicle for legal regulation of misogynist pornography may be "a hate speech law that . . . includes women as a protected social group." (32)

Mitchell Berman's contribution takes up the crime of blackmail, which he characterizes as "among the most delighting and devilish puzzles in criminal law theory." (37) As is typical of Berman's work, he brings his own delightful combination of insight, clarity and wit to solving the puzzle. Ultimately, he argues, the solution is to be found, with only slight tweaking, in the coercion-centered account of blackmail that he developed over a decade ago (coined the "evidentiary theory of blackmail"). The punchline of his contribution to this volume can thus be summarized as, "I'm still right." (For the slight tweak from a motive-centered account to a belief-centered account, see 101, fn 19.)

Doug Husak's provocative essay "The Alleged Act Requirement in Criminal Law" (ch. 4) argues that no such requirement exists in Anglo-American law. The act requirement, if indeed there is one, is a requirement that criminal liability be imposed only in response to a defendant's actions, rather than his omission to act. Despite statements in a multitude of criminal statutes, case law, the Model Penal Code, and nearly every criminal law textbook affirming that a general act requirement does indeed exist in criminal law, Husak concludes that such claims are based on two confusions: first, a confusion "about what acts are" and, second, a confusion about "how the act requirement should be formulated." (108) With evident exasperation, Husak declares, "One wonders why anyone can express such confidence that the criminal law contains an act requirement when he is so confused about these two basic issues." (108).

Yet one might just as easily wonder, pace Husak, why we should want to conflate three quite distinct questions: (1) whether there is indeed an act requirement - that is, whether such a requirement is recognized as a valid legal criminal law norm; (2) whether we have an adequate conceptual understanding of what acts are -- that is, whether we can make sense of what acts are; and (3) whether we have an adequate normative understanding of whether and how an act requirement should be formulated in criminal law -- that is, whether such a requirement is defensible. For the legal positivist, at least, the questions of whether a norm makes sense (its philosophical merits) and whether it is defensible (its moral merits) are distinct from whether the norm exists as law. On a Hartian positivist account, the first question above fails to be answered according to whether an act requirement is recognized as a valid legal norm according to the relevant rule(s) of recognition in any given jurisdiction(s). Thus the question becomes, "Is the act requirement recognized as law according to sources such as criminal statutes and case law in Anglo-American legal systems?". Undoubtedly, the answer to that question is "yes" -- and as such there is indeed a general act requirement in Anglo-American criminal law. Still, as is characteristic of Husak's work, he does a masterful job of demonstrating that we are indeed conceptually confused (about what acts are) and normatively confused (about how the act requirement should be formulated). Thus, while Husak fails to convince this reader that the requirement is not a valid legal norm within existing Anglo-American criminal law, his chapter presents a philosophically insightful and challenging critique of that norm.

Andrew Ashworth's treatment of attempts demonstrates his unparalleled ability to set out both the broad context and fine-grained details of criminal law doctrine and theory with clarity and nuance. He presents a comprehensive overview of the three most vexing issues in attempt liability: fault requirements, conduct requirements, and the so-called impossibility defense. After setting out a comparative analysis of US and UK law on each and surveying the most influential and cogent philosophical treatments of these issues, Ashworth gestures toward an intriguing solution to resolving the confusion surrounding attempt liability: "why do we not," Ashworth queries, "instruct our law reformers to consider on each occasion what they think should justifiably be criminalized, rather than relying on the rather capricious operation of the general presumption of inchoate liability?" (142) In other words, why do we not move the issue of attempt liability from the general part of criminal law to the special part? He answers his own rhetorical question by pointing to a lack of political will amongst law reformers in the UK to abolish general-part attempt doctrine from the criminal law. One can only imagine that US law reformers would have even less appetite for any move toward abolition of general attempt liability, for fear of appearing "soft" on crime. Whatever may come of the practical suggestions for criminal law reform defended by Ashworth, it must be noted that the chapter is a delight to read, for its clarity, comprehensive coverage, and thoroughly sensible and persuasive arguments for law reform. For any members of a non-UK audience who may still be unfamiliar with Ashworth's criminal law textbook (for, surely, no UK reader would be unfamiliar with it), this chapter exemplifies why Professor Ashworth has earned his place as a leading criminal law scholar in the Anglophone world.

John Deigh's contribution, "Responsibility," is curious in a number of ways -- not least because the chapter occasionally seems to be concerned more directly with theories regarding punishment, rather than theories regarding responsibility -- two issues which, while clearly related, have generated somewhat distinct sets of literature and lines of argument in the field of criminal law philosophy. Moreover, or perhaps due to the above-noted curiosity, Deigh's contribution does not address some of the most intriguing and widely noted work on criminal responsibility (such as that by Nicola Lacey). Putting these concerns aside, Deigh's contribution is indeed a welcome addition to the literature insofar as he draws on moral psychology, his principal area of expertise, in presenting a lucid and enlightening overview of some of the standard literature concerning moral agency, criminal responsibility, and the justification of punishment.

Although some other contributions in the volume focus primarily on legal doctrine with relatively scant engagement with philosophy, while others offer primarily philosophical reflections with scant engagement with legal doctrine, most of the contributions illustrate complex intersections of law and philosophy. Walter Sinnott-Armstrong and Ken Levy's contribution, "Insanity Defenses" and Joshua Dressler's, "Duress" both exemplify the first tendency, focusing primarily on legal doctrine and drawing almost exclusively on case law and academic literature that is itself relatively doctrine-focused. This observation is not offered as a criticism and, indeed, in Dressler's case, the approach is especially appropriate to the topic. As he well illustrates, the criminal law on duress is constituted by a frustratingly imprecise collection of defense doctrines, situated at the border of justification and excuse. Dressler's clear and careful explanation of existing legal doctrine delivers a number of rewards to the reader, including an illuminating explanation of one of the most perplexing variants of duress, the UK's doctrine of "duress of circumstances." (291-292).

The four essays that focus on punishment theory demonstrate the second tendency noted above, approaching their respective topics through a primarily philosophical, rather than doctrinal, lens. Dolinko's "Punishment" offers a detailed survey of many well-recognized views regarding the justification of punishment -- focusing primarily on consequentialist, retributivist and communicative approaches to the problem of punishment. While the chapter would serve well as a starting point in thinking about punishment in an undergraduate or US law school course, more advanced study would benefit from a review of recent pluralist theories of punishment, such as those developed by Gardner and Tasioulas. Carol Steiker's account of the new frontier in debates regarding the death penalty deftly unpacks the recent literature by anti-death penalty retributivists, surveying and critically examining this relatively new agenda in anti-death penalty argumentation. Rather than defending any particular set of arguments, Steiker clarifies and organizes the claims being made in this literature and sets out the considerations that must be addressed in order to succeed in defending a non-consequentialist, secular abolitionism.

Duff's essay, "Mercy," is perhaps the most straight-forwardly philosophical contribution, with only one somewhat strained attempt to integrate reference to posited law in distinguishing mercy as a virtue of a judge qua human being, from justice as a virtue of a judge qua role-occupant within a system of criminal law. (480-481). Of course, the lack of doctrinal engagement is not a point for criticism, given that the opportunity for mercy arises most naturally in the realm of highly discretionary decision making -- that is, where legal doctrine constrains the least. While I remain unconvinced that Duff's account of mercy marks an improvement on Tasioulas' and question what account of judicial-role morality could underpin his claim that a judge who shows mercy "is no longer acting simply as a judge" (478) the chapter is nonetheless a valuable contribution, and Duff's considerable philosophical gifts add further complexity to our understanding of mercy. Finally, Stephen Garvey deftly outlines the broad themes of abolitionist thought in his contribution, "Alternatives to Punishment." His explanation of restorative justice deserves to be widely read and taken on board by those sociologists and legal scholars writing in this rhetoric-ridden and poorly-defined field; for it may give them the motivation and resources to be more clear about what, precisely, restorative justice is: a form of punishment, a theory of punishment, or an alternative to punishment?

As noted above, many of the essays successfully engage both law and philosophy, illustrating the complex intersections between the two. Especially noteworthy in this regard are Christopher Kutz's contribution on "The Philosophical Foundations of Complicity Law" and Michael Moore's essay on "Causation in the Criminal Law" -- both of which draw upon comprehensive accounts of existing legal doctrine and engage philosophically sophisticated arguments in seeking to provide the best explanation of these doctrines. Moore's contribution illuminates and clarifies the "tournament field of competing doctrines" regarding when and why an agent may be said to have caused certain results. As one who has often struggled to help students understand the wide variety of seemingly incoherent tests for causation, I especially welcomed Moore's taxonomy of the dizzying array of doctrines and will undoubtedly find it a valuable resource in my own teaching. Kutz's explanation of complicity doctrine is by comparison somewhat more ambitious, insofar as he does not merely attempt to clarify and organize the array of existing complicity doctrines, but instead seeks to defend a particular (controversial) view of complicity, according to which an accomplice's act need not have actually made any causal contribution to the principal's crime. (164)

Kutz's focus on defending his own account of complicity, rather than undertaking a more general clarificatory survey of a range of views, makes his contribution somewhat an outlier in this collection of essays. Although, it should be noted, Alexander's essay on "Culpability" goes even further in this direction. By adopting limiting assumptions drawn from his own work with Kim Ferzan (with contributions by Stephen Morse), Alexander focuses on defending their idiosyncratic understanding of an actor's culpability as necessarily independent of whether she caused harm and their (somewhat less idiosyncratic) denial of the relevance of the actor's character to her culpability. In contrast, Ferzan's essay, "Justification and Excuse" resists this tendency and offers instead an admirably balanced account of a wide range of philosophical perspectives, while bracketing many of her own views that might have made her contribution more peculiar to the iconoclastic account of culpability she and Alexander have developed (e.g., 263, fn 6).

Several of the contributions in this collection would have benefited from greater recognition of the historical context in which the criminal law developed and critical reflection on the ways in which various structural inequalities have shaped the criminal law. For example, issues such as race, racism, and poverty go almost entirely without consideration, thus failing to account for many aspects of an adequate explanation of the actual human practice of criminal law. That said, Marcia Baron's contribution ("Gender Issues in the Criminal Law") serves as a welcome exception, providing a masterful overview of three areas of substantive criminal law where gender issues are most evident: provocation, self-defense, and rape. She begins by reminding the reader of the historical context in which the substantive criminal law developed, noting women's lack of full citizenship throughout much of this time. Throughout, she remains attentive to the realities that shape outcomes in criminal cases. For example, in defending the view that rape law should be reformed such that non-consent is presumed in many cases where there is an absence of affirmative consent, she draws the reader's attention to the fact that "social conventions regarding sex are notoriously unsettled; moreover much of what passes as 'conventional' in this context wears on its face norms of male aggression and female passivity." (376). While Baron does not fully address the implications for the presumption of innocence in offering her reverse-presumption argument, her contribution does succeed in drawing upon and integrating a far broader range of considerations regarding the real life social context in which the criminal law operates.

On the whole, the essays in this volume offer superb examples of analytic philosophy as applied to the puzzles of criminal law doctrine, authored by many of the leading scholars in the field. Editors Deigh and Dolinko are to be congratulated for bringing together this tremendous resource for those seeking a clear and comprehensive account of the current state of Anglo-American criminal law philosophy.