The Powers of Pure Reason: Kant and the Idea of Cosmic Philosophy

Placeholder book cover

Alfredo Ferrarin, The Powers of Pure Reason: Kant and the Idea of Cosmic Philosophy, University of Chicago Press, 2015, 325pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226243153.

Reviewed by Susan Meld Shell, Boston College


This is an unusually ambitious work whose many virtues cannot be adequately summarized in a short review. Alfredo Ferrarin not only presents a highly original account of main features of Kant's critical oeuvre (under the rubric of what he calls "the idea of cosmic philosophy") but also introduces a novel philosophic approach, one that combines several of the best features of close reading, Entwicklungsgeschichte, and analytic reconstruction and critique. Unlike many scholars, who concentrate on individual texts or work with a view to discrete topics such as epistemology or ethics, Ferrarin sets his designs on uncovering the basic intention(s) animating Kant's philosophic efforts during the final critical decades of his career. This goal motivates exceptionally unified and capacious readings whose broad scope is accompanied by an unusually nuanced and philosophically fruitful attention to Kant's language and rhetoric. The pattern that emerges is less a steady progression on Kant's part toward ever greater clarity on central issues than a series of oscillating efforts to give due weight, sometimes within a single work or even paragraph, to competing tendencies embedded in core insights and the dilemmas to which they give rise. Ferrarin does not hesitate to say where he thinks Kant goes wrong, but his general attitude is one of attentive and sympathetic retrieval, born of desire to discover what Kant really thought and open to the possibility that Kant's "mistakes" may be less remediable errors than indications of "surds" endemic to thinking as such.

The central question of the work is: what is reason? (e.g., what are reason's powers and limits?). Ferrarin's abbreviated answer is: a priori synthesis. But the unity of reason, so understood, is at once a ground and foundation and an ongoing task. Reason is neither the traditional handmaiden of the understanding, nor Hume's humble tool of the passions, but rather a legislating power "giv[ing] rise to objects that are not actual productions but syntheses of forms to which empirical matter will forever remain external and given." [10] Reason's power is thus inseparable from its limit.

At the same time reason's power is more than cognitive; it also includes an "overarching attitude" toward its own cognitions and an awareness of "interests and ends" that motivate all of reason's activities and is grounded in the "decision," as Ferrarin puts it, to take "pure reason" as our "our guide and arbiter, our unconditional judge and only authority." [11] The slippage in subjects is not accidental: reason is at once impersonal and active only through the individual "I" or subject. Among the most interesting of Ferrarin's detailed investigations is that of the delicate and perhaps not altogether stable relation between the transcendental ego (the I of transcendental apperception), the individual subject, and the conscious and embodied self. Who or what does the judging and who is judged, in the terms evoked by Kant's famous metaphor of the tribunal of pure reason, is among the richest and most valuable of the author's investigations here. One of its other central merits is to shed new light on the meaning of "a priori synthesis" and its relevance not only for the first Critique but for the critical project as a whole, with all its shifting meanings.

If reason's power is that of "a priori synthesis," reason itself is "nothing but autonomy," which on Ferrarin's reading is not only pertinent to morality but constitues reason's "inner core and destination." [14] At the same time, "reason is divided against itself" both in the sense of legislating for two worlds, neither of which is self-sufficient, and in the sense of projecting notions that exceed reason's powers of comprehension. To state this duality differently: reason broadly understood is at once the source of concepts that constitute the thing-hood of objects in accordance with rules, and ideas that look past given objects toward some "ought" or standard, [16] (as suggested by the term " horizon") and prove, as Kant's thinking moves through the later 1780's and1790's, increasingly ambiguous in both scope and meaning. Reason is "finite" not because thinking is necessarily temporal, or constrained by sensibility, or historically relative but because "No given order or boundary counts for it" until "it comes up against the limits posed by its doomed attempt at harmonizing its own several functions." Reason is at once autarkic and not full master of its own destiny. [16]

Reason, in short, is activity that both limits itself and reaches out beyond itself, giving rise to a "cosmic idea" that expresses reason's unity while also putting it in question. As an effort to both articulate and rectify reason's troubled wholeness, "philosophy" itself proves to be a not altogether stable guide. Still the underlying thesis of the book, in the words of its author, is that for all its "developments and changes," for all its "seismic shifts," "Kantian philosophy is above all else a whole." [9]

Chapter One ("The Architectonic and the Cosmic Concept of Philosophy") presents an innovative reading of the first Critique, based largely on novel interpretation of the generally neglected Transcendental Dialectic and Doctrine of Method. In the author's view, these sections, far from being dispensable and/or embarrassing addenda, provide keys both to the argument of the larger work and to the critical enterprise as such. Ferrarin takes seriously not only Kant's portrayal of "reason" as "pure spontaneity" or "activity," with "needs," "interests," and "dissatisfactions" peculiar to itself, but also his various comparisons of that activity to organic growth, house-building, and the like -- metaphors familiar to even the most casual readers of Kant but rarely subjected to such systematic philosophic analysis. Fruits of Ferrarin's reading include the following:

1) Reason is a purposive principle of agency whose fundamental need ("to find meaning" [27]) and drive toward unity makes it both a guide to understanding that is indispensable for the constitution of experience, and that by virtue of this very drive reaches beyond experience through its projection of ideas, including, above all, that of the world as a totality. Insofar as it remains tethered to the understanding (i.e., to directing the latter's use), the totality in question is called nature, or the totality of all possible experience, which reason holds out before us (in accordance with the nice metaphor that Ferrarin here cites) like an ever-receding horizon that encompasses nonetheless a whole enclosed upon itself. But precisely because reason is not reducible to understanding, pure reason even in its speculative use cannot be confined, as much conventional scholarship is wont to do, to a merely negative role. To be sure, Kant, on the author's account, himself contributes to that misunderstanding in a number of ways and for reasons Ferrarin here explores at length. Not least is an ambivalence on Kant's part as to the relation between criticism and metaphysics proper, which Kant at times tends to conflate and at other times emphatically distinguishes, an ambivalence that may be grounded, as Ferrarin suggests, in the nature of reason itself.

2) The "finitude" of human reason cannot be reduced to its temporality as all reason, insofar as it includes the a priori power to receive, and thereby shape, the given, is to this extent necessarily temporal. (Ferrarin here approvingly repeats Onora O'Neill's pithy construal of "finite rational beings" as "finite beings" who are "rational" rather than as "rational beings" who are "finite." [17n.]) The paradoxes that arise from this inherently complex, not to say internally divided, power to give form is taken up at length in Chapter Two.

3) Reason's finitude takes the form of self-limitation that can be understood as a kind of self-completion, brought to fruition through critical philosophy and its accompanying exhaustive survey of the powers of the mind. But that task leaves over, and in some ways competes with, what Kant calls reason's "final," as distinguished from merely "essential," end(s): namely, fulfillment of a destiny directed toward the "highest good." Absent attention to that larger end, even critical philosophy, which corrects the one-eyed defects of its merely scholastic cousins, remains "cycloptic," or unable to do justice to reason's world-projective character. In later sections, especially Chapter Three, Ferrarin examines the fall-out accompanying certain fundamental shifts in the way that Kant understands, or at least portrays, the relation between speculative philosophy and this final end.

4) Reason cannot be reduced to self-conscious subjectivity, let alone to embodied rationality, and yet only acts in and through the latter. Reason, in short, is not a person but must nonetheless be distinguished, in its impersonality, from Hegel's Geist or Fichte's Ego even if Kant's arguments seem at times to point in their direction. The ambiguities accompanying this insight are explored at greater length both in Chapter Two (in lengthy treatments of both A and B versions of the Transcendental Deduction) and in a detailed appendix (on of whether or not the pure concepts of the understanding are thinkable apart from being already (somehow) schematized.)

Chapter Two ("A Priori Synthesis") explores the various meanings of "a priori synthesis" in transcendental and ordinary empirical cognition, in mathematics, in practical uses of reason, and -- finally and most problematically -- in metaphysics. Ferrarin is especially helpful in clarifying the meaning and role of the term "objective reality" for Kant (though the author is not always as observant as he might be of his own stricture against confusing "reality" [Realität] and "actuality" [Wirklichkeit] (or reality as it now commonly understood)). The a priori synthesis (or syntheses) on which ordinary empirical cognition depend is an activity whose "priority" must be taken in a non-temporal sense, or as "the a priori of the empirical" [179]. On the author's reading, a priori intuition retains a "relative independence" and is, as such, part of the original articulation of pure reason, whose powers include that of "receptivity" (or the a priori intuition of time and space) no less than those that gives rise to concepts and ideas. At the same time, as the author is also at pains to show, this understanding of reason is, even in the A edition of the first Critique, where it is most prominent, a not altogether stable one.

In Chapter Three ("Kant on Kant") Ferrarin explores in detail the subsequent course of this and related sources of instability as they play out in Kant's later thought. Beginning with a novel and painstaking analysis of Kant's own puzzlingly "inaccurate" summaries of the first Critique's basic structure and plan (revised descriptions of which appear as early as the Prolegomena [1783] and B edition [1787]), the author traces the growing eclipse of both the Transcendental Aesthetic and the Transcendental Dialectic and Doctrine of Method as originally conceived, culminating in the famous migration of many functions earlier attributed to speculative reason (in its then more positively conceived role) to newly discovered a priori powers of judgment. The author is especially helpful in puzzling out Kant's various, and often contradictory, uses of the term "knowledge" [Erkenntis] as they bear on the relation between science and wisdom along with interrelation of the faculties more generally. The source of these changes is closely correlated with, though it does not originate in, the new understanding of moral freedom that is manifest from the Groundwork onward, but that already has precedents in the Prolegomena and even, to some extent, in the first Critique itself. Its crux lies, if I understand Ferrarin correctly, in the vexed relation between the self-organizing impetus of reason, which finds essential fulfillment in speculative science or critical philosophy, and its final orientation toward achievement of the highest good. As freedom becomes reified (via the sole "fact of reason"), the positive role of the ideas is increasingly conceived as practical in a narrow sense. But the cosmic idea, on the author's reading, is not so much suppressed thereby as pressed toward reemerging in the form made manifest in the First Introduction to the Critique of Judgment.

It would be unfair to quibble with a study as rich with provocative and instructive insights as this one. Still, if I could express one regret, it would be that the notion of "autonomy" (which is used frequently and even flagrantly) throughout the book is not subjected to the same careful analysis, both textual and conceptual, that are accorded to many others. As the author is well aware, the term "autonomy" appears for the first time only in the Groundwork, where it refers not only to the law-giving power of reason but also, and more specifically, to the adequacy of reason's law to determine the will: an issue that the A edition of the first Critique had left unsettled. Indeed, it might well be argued that Kant's presentation, in that earlier work, of the question of the final end of reason as both "theoretical" and "practical" (A/805=B/833) was itself the symptom not only of internal instability of Kant's professed architectonic but also of an unresolved moral problem that had dogged Kant's thought throughout the decade leading up to the publication of the A edition and that would not be put to rest until 1785: namely, the seeming impossibility of a will motivated by pure reason alone. I say moral because anything less would not satisfy the moral demand for purity of will (a mercenary virtue wouldn't be virtue), while purity at the expense of reason (or as an act of grace) would threaten the integrity of morality from another direction (God alone knows right from wrong). As matters stand, Kant's invocation of the "highest good" relies upon a notion of deservingness (or worthiness to be happy) that apparently comes out of nowhere and, in any case, cannot be derived from the critique of pure reason as presented in the A edition.

Without entering into the details of what such an investigation would require, I would urge the following caution: namely, that the "cosmic" idea that Ferrarin explicates so compellingly may be more intimately bound up with the "cosmopolitan" in a political and moral (and not merely metaphorical) sense than Ferrarin allows. On such a reading, the unities and fissures that he traces might prove endemic less to thinking as such than to a certain moral outlook that is by no means inevitable, even for one oriented by Kant's (or reason's) fundamental questions. At the very least, it might render more understandable Kant's rejection of the possibility of a virtuous non-believer, a rejection that Ferrarin confesses he finds unintelligible [93n]. And it might have led him to pay greater attention both to the relation between reason and (moral) personality and to the structure and function of the sublime -- two topics, arguably central to the author's basic theme, that are here left largely unexplored.

This said, Ferrarin's illuminating and compelling study should be viewed as essential reading not only for those with a specific interest in the many timely subjects there discussed but also for anyone seeking a fresh appraisal of the accomplishment and promise of Kant's oeuvre as a whole.