The Question Concerning the Thing: On Kant's Doctrine of the Transcendental Principles

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Martin Heidegger, The Question Concerning the Thing: On Kant's Doctrine of the Transcendental Principles, James D. Reid and Benjamin D. Crowe (trs.), Rowman and Littlefield, 2018, 181pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781783484638.

Reviewed by Hakhamanesh Zangeneh, California State University, Stanislaus


This is a new translation of material which had appeared in English in 1967[1] but had long been out of print. Insofar as it increases the availability in English of Heidegger's interpretations of Kant, it is quite welcome. The book is also a welcome return of Heidegger translations to manuscripts dealing with traditional philosophical authors and themes. It can be argued that ever since the publication of Peter Trawny's reading of the 'black notebooks,' in 2014,[2] Heidegger studies has been taken hostage by Nazism studies. The majority of recent English translations released by the biggest publisher of Heidegger's works, Indiana University Press, have in fact been those diaries. The volume under review contrasts with those books in that it contains no biographical content and stays focused on a major text from the history of Western philosophy. To those hunting for the proverbial "gotcha" passages in this text, this reviewer would counsel "move along, nothing to see."

The philological provenance of the text is slightly complicated. In winter semester 1935/36, Heidegger taught a lecture course focused on Kant's Critique of Pure Reason (CPR), at the University of Freiburg in Breisgau. Before his death, he published a version of this material as a standalone book. After his death, the text of the original lecture course was published in his collected works. The previous English translation was based on the standalone book; the current translation is based on the lecture course in the collected works. According to the German editor, there are no significant differences between the two sources beyond a more detailed table of contents. Hence, this translation replaces the one now out of print.

The lecture course can no doubt be read on many different levels. I will only attempt to foreground a broader, more general but neglected question implied by this text. For discussions focusing on this course as a standalone interpretation of Kant, competing, e.g., with period Neo-Kantians, or as an episode in Heidegger's evolving readings of Kant, ranging from sympathetic to distanced, I refer the reader elsewhere for elaborate analyses.[3] Suffice it to say that in 1935/6 Heidegger seeks less to appropriate Kant for his own project than to try to situate Kant in a historical context.

The text of the lecture course has three major parts. The first, preparatory part, about a quarter of the book, gives some historical determination to the abstract topic in the title: The Question Concerning the Thing. Here, Heidegger returns to Aristotle and to interpretations of hypokeimenon and of tode ti that are well-known to his readers. The thing is determined in antiquity as a bearer of properties and as a particular. For those familiar with it, this material will be reminiscent of the first section of the contemporaneous essay on the art-work: "The Origin of the Work of Art." In both texts, Heidegger brings the substance-accident structure of the thing into connection with the subject-predicate structure of a proposition (in the essay he refers to these as Dingbau and Satzbau).

The third variable in the equation, so to speak, the third notion (which allows propositions and things to have the aforementioned structure) is the notion of truth. In Heidegger's interpretation of the history of truth, from antiquity to medieval times, the dominant paradigm of truth is that of 'rightness,' (Richtigkeit, rectitudo) which encompasses the more familiar adequation theory of truth. Heidegger's claim is that this conception of truth makes the proposition's structure "mirror" the thing's structure. All of this is more fully elaborated in other texts. In these pages we also find remarks of a methodological nature. Heidegger's works of the 1930s differ from those of the late 1920s, among other things, by virtue of a major foregrounding of the historicity of thought -- this would be the transition from 'fundamental ontology' to Seinsgeschichte. The remarks here are few and allusive, but they point to how he conceives of the history of philosophy and of his own methodology for studying the latter.

The second, main, part functions to more closely contextualize Kant historically and to situate the CPR. This part takes-up roughly another quarter of the book and contains significant choices. In contrast with a certain Anglo-Saxon practice, there is no mention of Hume. Instead, Heidegger places the CPR strictly within a context determined by modern science. The references are first to Galileo and Newton and then, eventually, to Leibniz, Wolff and Baumgarten as representing rationalist metaphysics. In fact, Heidegger claims that a 'mathematical spirit' is the origin of Modern metaphysics as such. He goes on to explicitly reject the characterization of the Modern in terms of Descartes and of subjectivity. Instead, he insists that 'the mathematical' already determines Descartes' entire context and contribution. Indeed, the 'scientific' character of Modernity saturates the determination of the latter in terms of subjectivity. This, again, follows from his conception of the history of truth. Modern philosophy unfolds, according to Heidegger, based on a conception of truth as certitude. The turn to subjectivity is only a consequence of this quest for certainty. In the context of Kant, Heidegger parses certainty as the 'scientific' and understands the 'scientific' as the 'mathematical.' Then, the latter is understood as the 'axiomatic,' and this in turn leads to the notion of the principle, Grundsatz, which finally opens the reading of the CPR focused on the principles of judgment.

In these pages, Heidegger scholars will recognize reflections on science and technology present in another contemporaneous text, the Beiträge zur Philosophie. Equally familiar will be the effect achieved by the stark rhetorical contrast between the Ancient and the Modern. Absent any mediating figures or texts, Heidegger's audience comes away convinced of an abrupt revolution dropping from the sky, as it were. As in many of his other writings of this period, Heidegger's narrative affords comparatively little detailed attention to medieval philosophy.

It is worth pausing to note that before beginning his commentary on Kant, Heidegger has dedicated the full first half of his manuscript (86 out of 171 pages in English) to an historical narrative. Thus, philologically, it is somewhat reductive to refer to this text as merely about Kant. In fact it is one half about Kant and one half about the history of truth. Now, it so happens that this latter focus, Heidegger's history qua history, has received substantially less attention in the literature. And yet this is arguably the feature that sets apart Heidegger's work from this period from both his earlier fundamental ontology and his later fourfold-centered writing. At the same time, this feature is also what makes an appraisal more challenging. For, how is one to judge a Kant-interpretation which is one half not about Kant? The question can be expanded. When we look at other texts from this period we find a similar pattern and a similar challenge. The Nietzsche interpretations are only partly about Nietzsche, the Hölderlin interpretations are only partly about (a small part of) Hölderlin's corpus, etc. What then is Heidegger really after and how are his writings from this period to be judged if not by way of a confrontation with a close reading of the primary texts? Could it be that Heidegger is at least as interested in the broad, horizontal, narrative account of the history of philosophy as he is in the details of a particular claim in a particular author?

This question is potentially problematic for philosophy at an institutional level today. For a certain type of contemporary Anglophone philosopher, whether nominally Analytic or Continental, given two competing interpretations, one of which is a close-reading, indeed a vertical, deep-dive into a narrow problem in one text, versus another which is a contextual, broad, horizontal, sweeping history, there is an indisputable predilection for the former interpretation. But why should this be? Why is the narrow argument better than the sweeping history? Where is this meta-philosophical valuation coming from? Heidegger, in the texts of his middle period, ostensibly does not share these values.

The third, major part, which encompasses about half the book, is an interpretation of the chapter of the CPR presenting the principles of all judgments, the Grundsatzkapitel (A148/B188 - A235/B294). This focus distinguishes the lecture course from the more well-known 1929 Kant and the Problem of Metaphysics, without making it unique among his many systematic manuscripts on Kant. One can find another course, between the 1929 work and the lectures under review, entitled The Essence of Human Freedom: An Introduction to Philosophy,[4] where Heidegger had already worked through the Analogies of Experience in addition to the third Antinomy, while pursuing the topic of causality. At one point, Heidegger refers back to the 1929 work and suggests that the 1935/36 course 'repeats' or 'completes' it (nachholen, but perhaps not "makes up for what was lacking" as the translation puts it). The relationship between these various Kant readings is the topic of scholarly discussion.[5] Unlike the earlier emphasis on time, imagination and auto-affection, the focus is now on Kant's conception of judgment (but without reference to the third Critique). While the sections studied develop further Kant's conception of time, there is no attempt made to connect this with the structure of Dasein. Again, unlike the 1929 book and the 1930 course on freedom and causality, his reading in 1935/6 is strongly determined by a large-scale history of philosophy.

The answer to the question concerning the thing must be decided, according to Heidegger, based on the highest principles of all synthetic judgments, because these make possible the "objectivity of the object." The latter is broken up into, on the one hand, the 'against' or the wherein and what of the object -- these are thematized in the Axioms and the Anticipations -- and on the other hand the existing of the object, the 'standing' -- this is studied in the Analogies and the Postulates. The 'against' and the 'standing,' the Gegen and the stand, constitute Gegenstand. As he works his way through the proof-structure of the principles, Heidegger shows each time that the principle is made possible by that which the principle itself makes possible. In other words, the principles are all subject to a circular proof-structure. But rather than judging the circularity as defect, in the culmination of the course, he interprets this circularity as a feature of the occurring of experience. Finally, this occurrence or this event is what opens up the "between" of humans and things. In resonance with other texts, Heidegger's analysis of the thing ultimately leads beyond the thing and beyond the human being, to that ecstatic opening which precedes both.

Overall this book should be of interest to distinct audiences, who might perhaps be drawn to different sections. There is a historical narrative for non-specialist philosophers, a textual commentary useful for students of the first Critique, and for the Heidegger scholar, a wiederholende Aneignung, a repeating-appropriation of a central text of the history of metaphysics.

As a translation, this book is quite readable (the Kant citations conform to Guyer/Wood, not Pluhar, thus, e.g., Vorstellung is "representation" as opposed to "presentation" -- which actually helps Heidegger's argument, e.g., p. 95). There are a few passages that are extremely challenging to translate and will not be accessible to those without the German.[6] As with any translation there are some debatable choices.[7] Finally, for a second printing, there are some errors to be corrected.[8] All translations contain a mix of such features; they are distinguished by the relative proportions thereof. The volume here reviewed negotiates them advantageously.

[1] Martin Heidegger, What is a Thing?, W. B. Barton Jr (tr.), V. Deutsch (tr.), E. T. Gendlin (introd.), Gateway Editions, Indiana, 1967.

[2] Peter Trawny, Heidegger and the Myth of a Jewish World Conspiracy, A. J. Mitchell (tr.), University of Chicago Press, 2015.

[3] See Daniel Dahlstrom, "Heidegger's Kantian Turn: Notes to His Commentary on the Kritik der reinen Vernunft," Review of Metaphysics, vol. 45, No. 2 (Dec. 1991), pp. 329-361. The Appendix to this essay contains a handy concordance to Heidegger's writings on the first Critique. An excellent book-length study is Chad Engelland's Heidegger's Shadow: Kant, Husserl and the Transcendental Turn, Routledge, New York, 2017.

[4] Martin Heidegger, The Essence of Human Freedom. An Introduction to Philosophy, T. Sadler (tr.), Continuum, 2012.

[5] See, e.g., Engelland (2017).

[6] These occur towards the end of the course, in commentary of the Anticipations of Perception. On page 149, "Ein solches Auf- und Vorliegendes (positum) kann als so Vor-liegendes und Besetzendes nur vernehmbar werden" is rendered as "Such an offering and presence . . . as present and lying-before". This seems to lose 'Besetzendes' and renders 'Aufliegendes' as 'an offering.' And on page 151, the sequence "Entgegen- und Vor-greifen . . . als entgegen-fassendes Vorgreifen . . . entgegen-vorgreifenden Vorstellens" is rendered as "counter-conceiving and preconceiving . . . counter-apprehending preconceiving . . . counter-preconceiving representation." But the introduction of conceptuality here seems very problematic.

[7] One such choice is uniformly translating Wesen as essence. Another is when Umgang is rendered as 'intercourse.' Thus a phrase like "Ich kann mit dem neuen iPhone nicht umgehen" would implicitly become: "I cannot have intercourse with the new iPhone." On page 114, the couple "erläuternd, erweiternd" is rendered as "explicative/ampliative" as opposed to "elaborative/extensive." On page 70, einsichtig is rendered once as "intelligible" (misleading) and 3 lines lower as "intuitive" (clearer).

[8] On page 42, the bracketed German should be "als eines Seienden," not "al [sic!] seines Seienden" and the translation should be modified accordingly. On page 48 the bracketed page break should read "[72]" and not "[GA 72]" -- that looks confusingly like a reference to volume 72. From page 65 to page 66, the same German expression is translated once as "Self-Grounding" and once as "self-justification". On page 132, "the possibility of thing [sic!]" should be "the possibility of a thing". On page 136, "allgemein und unmittelbar gegeben vorgestellt" is "represented universally and immediately given" but this should be "represented universally and as immediately given". In the next sentence " dieses Vorgestellte ist kein Begriff " should be "this represented is no concept" and not "this . . . represented no concept". On page 137, "human beings are also intuited intuitions" should be "human beings are also intuitions, are intuited". On page 150 and passim, Auffassen should be apprehension and not "interpretation."