Health, Luck, and Justice

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Shlomi Segall, Health, Luck, and Justice, Princeton UP, 2010, 239pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780691140537.

Reviewed by Leonard M. Fleck, Michigan State University



This volume starts with the question: What counts as a just distribution of health and health care? The brief initial answer given by Segall is, “Differences in health and health care are unjust if they reflect differences in brute luck” (p.1). Segall defends what he refers to as a responsibility-sensitive luck egalitarian account of health care justice. He contends that a luck egalitarian account of justice should be preferred to Rawls’ account of justice and that his own luck egalitarian account of health care justice should be preferred to the fair equality of opportunity account offered by Norman Daniels (1985; 2008). In the context of health care luck egalitarianism implies some denial of access to needed health care for those who have been irresponsible with regard to their health. What is distinctive of Segall’s version of luck egalitarianism is that it retains a moral commitment to universal and unconditional access to needed health care. But that moral commitment will not be rooted in some understanding of justice. Other moral values will underwrite that commitment. In that regard Segall characterizes his deep view as a moral pluralism in which justice is one value among others of equal importance.

Segall starts to address the core problem by noting the extraordinarily high health costs generated by individuals who consume large quantities of fatty food, or excess quantities of alcohol, or two packs of cigarettes per day for decades. The diabetes or cancer or heart disease incurred by these individuals will represent hundreds of thousands of dollars of “unnecessary” health care for each individual and hundreds of billions of dollars in health costs each year at the national level. Instead of those individuals having to bear those costs they will be spread out across the entire insured population. Is that fair to those individuals who have invested considerable effort and self-denial to protect their health against these illnesses but who still will have to pay a portion of those “excess” health costs in the form of higher taxes or insurance premiums? Segall will affirm the claim that this is unjust.

Cancer and diabetes and heart disease can happen to individuals for reasons that have nothing to do with personal behavior. This is why individuals associate with one another in insurance pools and see this as a fair arrangement. All are more or less uncertain as to their vulnerability to these disorders. But individuals who engage in behaviors that are very risky for health know there is a much higher probability they will be afflicted with these disorders, and so it seems they are “taking advantage” of more prudent individuals.

Readers will see in the prior paragraph some popular politically conservative themes. But that is not where Segall is coming from. He is committed to an egalitarian view of justice, specifically, a luck egalitarian view. He rejects egalitarian theories of health care justice, such as that offered by Daniels, because they are responsibility-insensitive. That is, Daniels would affirm that individuals who have abused their health still have a just claim to needed health care, even though those health needs are a product of self-destructive health choices. In contrast, Segall denies that those individuals would have a just claim to those resources. Affirming this latter proposition would seem to imply that these individuals ought to be denied access to the expensive life-prolonging health care that they need (unless they are able to pay for this care from their own financial resources). This is what has come to be known as the “abandonment” problem. But luck egalitarians in general do not want to embrace this conclusion. It seems cruel and inhumane, even if individuals have been given fair warning.

Segall considers several strategies that various luck egalitarians have attempted to use to avoid or defeat the abandonment objection (chapter four), but he finds all those strategies deficient. His own response to the abandonment problem is to take seriously value pluralism, which will mean in practice that other deep social values may be traded off or balanced against considerations of justice. Thus considerations of compassion will justify providing needed health care to reckless individuals whose bad health choices generated serious health problems for themselves. For Segall there is “moral space” that permits such a response. Imprudent individuals may not have a just claim to the health care they need because of reckless health choices, but it is not unjust for a society to provide those resources for reasons of compassion. Presumably, I would add, no one else’s just claims to needed health care are threatened or compromised by these acts of compassion. Segall may be mindful that egalitarian social compassion must have limits. Hence, he invokes the language of “basic needs” to identify the kind of health care that a compassionate society ought to provide to imprudent individuals (p.68).

In the central chapters (6-9) Segall addresses the question of what counts as a just distribution of health. For many this question will sound odd. Good health is not something that can be distributed or redistributed. One has it or one does not. But substantial recent research has called attention to the “social determinants of health”. Those determinants include income, wealth, physical and social quality of one’s neighborhood, and so on. Individuals with the very same health problem who receive the very same health services for that problem may nevertheless experience very different outcomes as a result of the effect of one of more of these social determinants, such as income class. From an egalitarian perspective this ought to be rectified.

But for Segall there are limits to what justice requires by way of rectification. He calls our attention to the “smoker/jogger” example. The smoker is likely to be substantially less well off health-wise than the jogger. Does this require rectification? It does not for Segall. Rectification will require that there is equal effort by two individuals to maintain their health. Otherwise, no considerations of justice will require social intervention. Segall adds as a second point that he is committed to luck prioritarianism in this regard. That is, if there is equal effort to preserve health by two individuals and one is worse off than the other (perhaps as a result of a genetic deficiency), then priority for social resources aimed at achieving equal opportunity for health ought to go to the worse off individual. This could generate what is known as the “bottomless pit” objection, but Segall contends that it is morally permissible to bring in considerations of social utility (maximizing average life expectancy) that would limit social obligations to the less well off health-wise. What he wants to avoid is the risk of “leveling down”, diminishing the health (life expectancy) of those with natural very good health in order to improve the health of the worse off health-wise.

In the concluding chapters (10-11) Segall applies his theory to matters of global health justice. His most general claim as a luck egalitarian is that it is always unfair that individuals are worse off than others through no fault of their own. He sees this broad commitment as implying what he calls a cosmopolitan version of luck egalitarianism. That is, there are no good moral reasons for tolerating grossly diminished health status in children around the world who clearly are less well off health-wise through no fault of their own. For Segall, sufficentarianism is an inadequate response to the needs of these children, i.e., bringing them up to some minimally decent standard. Luck egalitarianism requires more than that.

Some critical comments are in order at this point, mostly with a focus on the first half of the book (though with clear implications for the latter half). What exactly should count as a “basic need”? Segall fails to answer this, but it is a critical and complicated question at the heart of the health reform debates in which we are now engaged. What do we owe all our societal inhabitants in the way of access to needed health care? Callahan (1990; 2009) has pointed out that what we regard as health needs, practically speaking, is primarily a function of wherever the leading edge of medical technology is. This is a critical social issue because this has generated unsustainable increases in health care costs that threaten the just satisfaction of multiple other non-health social needs. To put this in perspective, in the US in 1960 we spent $26 billion on health care (5.2% of GDP), compared to $2.5 trillion in 2009 (17.3% of GDP), with projections of $4.5 trillion in 2018 (20% of GDP) [Truffer et al., 2010]. Other advanced countries in the world are only spending 8-10% of GDP for health care. Do we have any reason to believe our health care system is more just because we are spending so much more than everyone else?

We need to address the problem of how we can determine just limits to needed health care. Segall seems to believe that basic health needs are the ones that count so far as health care justice is concerned. But this concept is much more obscure than Segall seems to realize. One possible response to this problem is to provide a list of non-basic needs, such as various forms of cosmetic plastic surgery. However, this is not very helpful because this is a very short list.

More challenging are some of the extraordinarily expensive cancer drugs (cetuximab [Erbitux], bevacizumab [Avastin]) that cost $50,000-$130,000 for a course of treatment and yield only extra weeks or extra months of life (Fojo/Grady, 2009). Should we call such drugs “basic” because they are life-prolonging? Or should we call them “non-basic” because they prolong too little life? If they are “basic”, then Segall’s egalitarianism would require (for reasons of compassion, not justice) that they be provided to both prudent and imprudent cancer patients. If they are “non-basic”, then the “luck” part of Segall’s egalitarianism would seem to permit differential coverage of these drugs at social expense for the prudent and imprudent. His egalitarian commitments, however, would seem to require non-funding for both the prudent and imprudent. These are incoherent commitments that require more critical attention by Segall. He might have avoided this sort of problem if he had included many more clinical scenarios, which would have forced him to face the very practical concrete implications of his theoretical perspective.

In my view Daniels’ fair equality of opportunity account would offer a fairer and more reasonable response to the justice-challenges posed by these drugs. What these drugs really represent are very marginal health care benefits (very brief prolongations of life) at extraordinarily high social cost. The virtue of Daniels’ fair equality of opportunity account is that he has the ability to say, relative to all the other unmet health care needs in our society which would yield substantial opportunity gains, that these particular cancer drugs yield too little gain in effective opportunity, and therefore, deserve very low priority so far as social funding is concerned. Furthermore, from a moderately egalitarian perspective of health care justice, it does not matter whether prudent or imprudent individuals have these end-stage cancers. In neither case would such individuals have a just claim to these drugs (and the billions of dollars necessary to access them), nor would social compassion justify providing these drugs at social expense if other serious health needs would go unmet that represented substantial opportunity gains.

Here is another example. Patients in the end-stages of Alzheimer’s (which might last two or more years) or patients in a persistent vegetative state (who may survive for many years, as in the Schiavo case) may have their lives sustained by means of feeding tubes, which by themselves represent cheap basic care. But the long term care facilities where these patients are housed will cost almost $100,000 for each life-year sustained. We can readily assume that very few of these patients ended up in these debilitated states as a result of imprudent health choices, and, as I say, the care they receive is basic. However, given limited funding to meet unlimited health needs, and hence the need to establish priorities, would justice or compassion or any other fundamental moral value justify giving higher priority to the Alzheimer or PVS patients for life-sustaining care than to patients who were HIV+ who needed $35,000 worth of drugs per year to sustain their lives another twenty years? Likewise, there are some very expensive drugs (infliximib at $22,000 per year) needed to control the debilitating effects of rheumatoid arthritis. I have no idea whether or not a good argument could be made for calling these drugs “basic” or “non-basic” care. But I am certain that a fair equality of opportunity account of health care justice would require that these drugs (which might not save life-years) nevertheless deserve much higher priority for funding than the feeding tubes needed to sustain the lives of patients with end-stage Alzheimer’s or PVS. That is because these arthritis drugs would sustain increased functioning and quality of life for these patients for many years.

There are a couple other critical points that ought to be noted. Segall describes his position as a responsibility-sensitive version of luck egalitarianism. But the fact of the matter is that it is rarely the case that individuals are 100% responsible for their ill health. Some genetic factors may predispose them to some form of heart disease or cancer, which they may “help along” by “choosing” to smoke in an older part of the city with considerable remaining industrial air pollution that would itself increase vulnerability to heart disease or cancer. And individuals may choose to smoke a pack a week, or pack a day or two packs a day. And individuals may struggle for many years to quit smoking, sometimes being successful for several years, then relapsing as a result of some prolonged stressful life events. Under these very complex circumstances (genetic, social, environmental) and quasi-deliberate individual choices, how can we fairly determine from a luck egalitarian perspective what an individual’s just claims to costly health care interventions are for their heart disease or cancer? Segall might say that all these health care claims are going to be met, sometimes for reasons of justice, sometimes for reasons of compassion. But there would seem to be a practical difference between those two sorts of reasons, or I would contend there ought to be a difference between those two sorts of reasons. There are limits to compassion, and there are limits to justice. How would Segall determine what those limits are in those respective cases from the perspective of his responsibility-sensitive version of luck egalitarianism? I could not find an adequate enough response to that question.

The reader should know that I offer these critical comments in the spirit of philosophic engagement. This is a thought-provoking volume deserving of a wide readership among academics and health professionals and health policy analysts who must struggle with the challenges of trying to create a more just health care system that gives due regard to issues of personal responsibility for one’s own health status and costs that might be imposed on social budgets.


Callahan, D. 2009. Taming the Beloved Beast: How Medical Technology Costs are Destroying our Health Care System. Princeton, NJ: Princeton UP.

Callahan, D. 1990. What Kind of Life: The Limits of Medical Progress. New York: Simon and Schuster.

Daniels, N. 2008. Just Health: Meeting Health Needs Fairly. Cambridge: Cambridge UP

Daniels, N. 1985. Just Health Care. Cambridge: Cambridge UP.

Fojo, T. and Grady, C. 2009. How much is life worth? Cetuximab, non-small cell lung cancer, and the $440 billion question. Journal of the National Cancer Institute 101: 1044-48.

Truffer, CJ., Keehan, S., Smith S. et al. 2010. Health spending projections through 2019: The recession’s impact continues. Health Affairs 29 (March): in press.