Hegel and the Transformation of Philosophical Critique

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William F. Bristow, Hegel and the Transformation of Philosophical Critique, Oxford University Press, 2007, 258pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199290642.

Reviewed by Paul Franks, University of Toronto


William Bristow has written a superb book that makes a significant contribution both to the study of Hegel and Kant, and to current discussions of Hegelian and Kantian themes in epistemology.

One should not underestimate the difficulty of illuminating both Hegel and Kant. Hegelians and Kantians have been talking past each other for two hundred years or so, and it is remarkably hard to articulate either position in a way that does justice to the other. While Bristow is fully explicit that his book is primarily in the service of Hegelianism, he undertakes at the same time to be as fair as possible to Kantian objections. Along with its philosophical ingenuity and interpretive scrupulousness, this fair-mindedness helps to make Bristow's book the most successful account so far of the Hegelian criticism of Kant. The final chapter also contains a highly suggestive and strikingly original account of a Hegelian alternative to Kantian approaches in epistemology.

The basic gist of Hegel's criticism of Kant is well-known. 1) Hegel finds, at the heart of Kant's philosophy, the genuine insight that categories constitute reality -- that thinking is objective -- but Hegel also takes Kant to undermine his own insight by maintaining that these categories "are merely our thoughts, and separated from the thing as it is in itself by an insurmountable gulf."[1] The parochial character ascribed to the categories by Kant gives rise, not only to a certain dualism and formalism that Kant himself acknowledges, but also to the Hegelian accusation of subjectivism: foreclosure from the outset of the possibility of the objective knowledge to which philosophers have always aspired. 2) As an alternative, Hegel attempts to develop what he claims to be philosophy as presuppositionless, absolute knowing.

In recent years, thanks to articles by Karl Ameriks and Paul Guyer, the Kantians have had the upper hand.[2] They have responded to Hegel's criticism of Kant, 1) that Hegel ignores the fundamental point that, according to Kant, the pure categories -- though not their schematized twins -- may and indeed must be used to think, but not, of course, to know things in themselves. The Kantian thesis that the objects of our knowledge are appearances follows from the parochial character he ascribes to the spatio-temporal forms of sensibility, and is not directly connected to Kant's conception of the faculty of understanding and its categories, which are common to all thinkers and are not peculiar to human minds. Notwithstanding whether Kant is right or wrong about space and time -- and there has been a lively debate about this question in light of developments in geometry and physics -- Hegel's criticism misses the point. Moreover, 2) far from proceeding without presuppositions, Hegel rejects Kant's critical approach to the human cognitive faculty at the cost of regressing to a version of pre-Kantian dogmatism.

The first Kantian response has seemed undeniable. Hence, no matter what one thinks of Hegel's alternative, his criticism of Kant has appeared to be based on a sophomoric misunderstanding. However, Bristow's book not only gives a clear defence of Hegel against the charge of dogmatism, it also gives perhaps the first significant response to the first charge that Hegel misses Kant's point. Thus the debate is ushered into a new stage.

In Chapter One, Bristow undertakes to show that, contrary to Ameriks and Guyer, Hegel does indeed have grounds for the charge that Kant's philosophy is a kind of subjectivism, not only because of the status Kant assigns to the forms of sensibility, but also because of the way in which he portrays the categorial forms of understanding. Pains are taken to avoid uncharitable interpretations of Kant, such as the ascription to him of a Cartesian or "empirical" idealism.

Bristow proceeds to deepen the Hegelian criticism of Kant by arguing, in Chapter Two, that Hegel has grounds for the suspicion that Kant's commitment to subjectivism is pre-determined by Kant's conception of critique. For Kant's conception of critique is his version of the characteristically modern idea of autonomy, expressed in the demand that norms have validity only insofar as their validity claims are intelligible to the individual subject. Indeed, the very idea of Kantian critique

already implies that the self-reflecting rational subject is the ultimate validator or legislator of the authority of the claims of reason; thus critique already institutes, methodologically, in the very stance of the epistemological investigation, 'conformity to the subject' as the normative ground of our knowledge, and with it, of course, Kantian subjectivism. (64)

In Chapter Three, Bristow shows that, in his early Jena writings, prior to the Phenomenology of Spirit (1807), Hegel rejects not only Kantian critique, but also the characteristically modern idea of autonomy it expresses. On the view Hegel holds in these texts, there is no way to avoid presuppositions. Either one must presuppose a subject-object dualism that precludes speculative knowledge, or else one must presuppose a subject-object identity that begs the question in favour of speculative knowledge. In Hegel's special sense of the term, only the former counts as dogmatism, since it implicitly treats one term of a dualism, which is ipso facto finite, as absolute. (166)[3] However, to a Kantian, and perhaps to any non-Hegelian, Hegel's own presupposition of subject-object identity cannot help but appear dogmatic in the more familiar sense that, on the most contentious issue between Hegel and his opponents, he simply begs the question. Nevertheless, even here, Bristow argues, Hegel is self-conscious and far from cavalier about matters epistemological.

Later, however, Hegel himself comes to see his early Jena position as dogmatic and as harbouring an inner tension, as Bristow explains in Chapter Four. In his later Jena period, Hegel comes to acknowledge the characteristically modern demand that the validity of norms must be intelligible to the intelligible subject. Thus, as Bristow argues in Chapter Five, Hegel develops in the Phenomenology a way of meeting the modern demand without precluding speculative knowledge, indeed without any presuppositions whatsoever. The key to this procedure is the idea of an inquiry in which everything is at stake, including the criteria of the inquiry itself. This is possible insofar as the inquiring subjects are open to changing their criteria of rationality and thereby to their own self-transformation. Thus Hegel ultimately affirms modern autonomy and develops an approach to epistemology that is, in Bristow's words, "genuine critique." (229) Turning the tables on the Kantians, then, Bristow argues that, properly understood, Hegelian phenomenology is more critical and less dogmatic than its Kantian predecessor.

I will now comment in more detail on 1) Bristow's account of the subjectivity of the categories, and 2) his closing sketch of Hegel's phenomenological method.

The Alleged Subjectivity of the Categories

Bristow is right to point out, in response to Ameriks and Guyer, that the universality of the categories among all thinkers is a red herring (39). Since intellectual intuition is, if not a demonstrably real possibility, nevertheless a problematic alternative to thinking that cannot be excluded, what matters is whether thinking is inherently limited, or whether it can in principle reach all the way, as it were, to things in themselves. Of course, Kant says explicitly that we can and must think things in themselves by means of the pure categories. But Bristow seeks to reconcile these passages with others in which Kant says that, apart from sensible intuition, thoughts involving the categories have no sense and meaning (Sinn und Bedeutung).[4] So he takes Kant to be saying that we can and must employ the "limit-concept" of noumena in the negative sense, but that such thoughts remain subjective in the sense that they express nothing more than the form of our understanding.

This certainly moves the debate to a new stage. But the defender of the Ameriks-Guyer line may respond as follows. First, while Bristow admits that he cannot render all of Kant's statements about things in themselves consistent, he perhaps underestimates how emphatic Kant is in passages where he insists on the need, not only for a "limit-concept", but also for what we might call a positive "boundary-concept". Here is one notable example:

Above we noted limits of reason with respect to all cognition of mere beings of thought; now … we can also determine the boundaries of pure reason; for in all boundaries there is something positive (e.g., a surface is the boundary of corporeal space, yet is nonetheless itself a space; a line is a space, which is the boundary of a surface; a point is the boundary of a line, yet is nonetheless a locus in space), where limits contain mere negations. The limits announced … are still not enough after we have found that something lies beyond them (although we will never cognize what that something may be in itself). For the question now arises: How does our reason relate to the connection of that with which we are acquainted to that with which we are not acquainted, and never will be? Here is a real connection of the known to the wholly unknown (which it will always remain), and if the unknown should not become the least bit better known -- as in fact is not to be hoped -- the concept of this connection must still be able to be determined and brought to clarity.

We should, then, think for ourselves an immaterial being, an intelligible world, and a highest of all beings (all noumena), because only in these things, as things in themselves, does reason find completion and satisfaction, which it can never hope to find in the derivation of the appearances from the homogeneous grounds of those appearances; and we should think such things for ourselves because the appearances actually do relate to something distinct from them (and so entirely heterogeneous), in that appearances always presuppose a thing in itself, and so they provide notice of such a thing, whether or not it can be cognized more closely.[5]

Second, Ameriks may be defended against Bristow's charge that, in the following passage, he offers an "objective interpretation" of thought about things in themselves against which Kant himself warns:

On the basis of the distinction [between pure and schematized categories], the Kantian can say that (contra Jacobi) what goes beyond the sensible is not a wholly amorphous domain but rather something which can be allowed some sort of conceptual order. This order is one that holds for all thinkers, and it can even be made determinate by us as long as we have another type of data than the spatio-temporal to make use of, as in fact occurs with our moral faculty.[6]

Ameriks' emphasis here -- like Kant's in the passage cited immediately above -- is on the use of the pure categories to determine or to specify the connection between appearances and the things in themselves which they presuppose. And this need not imply that "Kant cannot really mean what he says" (43) when he says that pure categories lack sense and meaning. For it is possible to distinguish between the determining of things by a formal and empty thought, and the sense and meaning that thoughts have when they are of an object.

To grasp this distinction, it is helpful to consider the status of thoughts concerning general logical form before we turn to thoughts concerning pure categorial form. The principle of contradiction, "that no predicate pertains to a thing that contradicts it",[7] is a thought that determines things in general, both sensible objects and things in themselves. However, it is not a thought of any object in particular. For a thought of an object is directed to a thing insofar as it is actual, or insofar as it is really possible, and this is a directedness that can be supplied by intuition, and perhaps -- as Ameriks suggests at the end of the passage quoted above -- by autonomous volition. Only when it is object-directed in this way -- which of course deserves extensive discussion elsewhere -- is thought said by Kant to possess "sense and meaning".[8] A defender of Ameriks' position may say something similar about pure categorial form: the thought that every property of a thing either is or is grounded in a fundamental property that requires no such further grounding, may be said to determine things in general in accordance with the pure category of substance, and thus to have determinate consequences for any thing whatsoever, including things in themselves; but the thought is nevertheless an expression of the form of the discursive understanding, and is not a thought directed to any object. Thus, pure categorial thought determines things in themselves, affirming that they must have determinate formal properties, and is to that extent "objective"; but it is an expression of the empty form of the discursive understanding, and is to that extent "subjective".

To be sure, this raises further questions of a particularly knotty kind, and these show that the debate about the alleged subjectivity of the categories is by no means over. Suppose it is granted that, although we cannot think of things in themselves in the way required for cognition, we can and must think them as being in certain determinate ways, since our thinking is bound by the pure categories. On the one hand, the source of the necessity for our thinking them as being in these ways is our own discursive understanding, not the things in themselves. On the other hand, it is necessary for us to think of them as being in these ways, so we cannot think of them as being otherwise. Is it possible, then, for us to frame the thought that things in themselves might not be as we must think them to be? Would the mere possibility of such a thought be sufficient to vindicate the Hegelian charge of subjectivism? Or would the Hegelian charge be vindicated only if there were some actual reason to doubt that things in themselves conform to the pure categories?

The Supposed Presuppositionlessness of Hegel's Phenomenological Method

According to Bristow, Hegel regards the subjectivism of Kant's philosophy as determined by a presupposition -- the presupposition that, since "nothing counts as authoritative for us except insofar as it can be validated in critical reflection", (70) the criterion employed by reflection can only be our own "(merely formal) self-relating activity." (78) In his early Jena period, Hegel rejects this presupposition, and indeed the modern conception of the autonomy of thought that it expresses. For it, he substitutes the alternative presupposition that we -- or Hegel and Schelling, at any rate -- already possess the idea of philosophy and can use it as our criterion in criticism. (171-2) Later, however, Hegel comes to appreciate the modern principle of autonomy, and accordingly he proposes in the Phenomenology a new practice of criticism that dispenses with presuppositions altogether, a practice that accords with the principle better than Kantian critique.

Kantians are apt to think that Hegel's mature work exhibits the dogmatism with which he himself might charge his earlier thinking. There can be no doubt that to render the claim to presuppositionlessness plausible is a profound challenge.[9] However, Bristow rises to the challenge admirably. I want to draw particular attention to his highly illuminating account of Phenomenology, §84, where Hegel responds to the problem, raised earlier in the Introduction, of how an investigation of knowing can employ a criterion while dispensing with every presupposition that determines the investigation's outcome:

Consciousness provides its criterion from within itself, and the investigation is thereby a comparison of consciousness with itself; for the distinction made above falls within it. In consciousness, one thing exists for another, or consciousness contains in general the determinateness of the moment of knowing; at the same time, this other is to consciousness not only for it, but also outside of this relation, in itself: the moment of truth. Thus, in that which consciousness declares within itself as the in-itself or the true, we have the criterion consciousness itself establishes by which to measure its knowing.[10]

Clearly, Hegel intends to say here that the required criterion is immanent to consciousness, so that no presupposition on our part is necessary. But it is tempting to read the passage in a way that precisely undermines the claim to presuppositionlessness -- to read it as a dogmatic assertion of the idealist thesis that it is impossible for the in-itself or absolute, which we seek to know, to transcend consciousness.[11] Such a view would appear to differ little from Hegel's earlier view.

However, Bristow reads the passage differently. He emphasizes that,

If we can be assured that both knowing and truth (being-for-us and being-in-itself) are immanent to consciousness, and hence, that they can be compared to test (phenomenal) knowing, this is not because we can simply presuppose as a condition of our inquiry that the traditional object of metaphysics is somehow there for consciousness, however obscurely, to serve as standard, but rather because our object in this inquiry is (immediately, anyway) exactly not the object of metaphysics (the transcendence of which is an open question), but knowledge. (222)

To further develop Bristow's reading, one might adduce §80: "the goal is as necessarily fixed for knowledge as the serial progression; it is the point where knowledge no longer needs to go beyond itself, where knowledge finds itself, where concept corresponds to object and object to concept." In short, the goal of knowledge is correspondence between our claims about how things are and the standards we take our claims to have to meet; when a given shape of consciousness is unstable, and knowledge needs to go beyond itself, then the knowledge in question is phenomenal; conversely, when there is no further need for transformation, either of our fundamental claims about how things are, or of our fundamental conception of the standards they must meet, then the goal of absolute knowledge will have been attained. Epistemic stability functions as a sort of meta-criterion, against which particular pairs of criteria and bodies of knowledge may be judged. This is a minimal proposal, apparently involving no presupposition either about what concept-object correspondence consists in, or about whether it is attainable.[12]

Central to Bristow's defence of Hegel's claim to presuppositionlessness is the idea that Hegel is going further along a path on which Kant had already taken important steps. Kant dissociates epistemological inquiry from the object of metaphysics, stepping back from the object and our presupposition that we can know it, in order to determine whether metaphysical knowledge is indeed possible. But Kant does not dissociate the inquiry from the subject, which is itself no longer assumed to be an object of metaphysical knowledge, but which is nevertheless -- as empty form -- the only available criterion of knowledge. Thus, from Hegel's point of view, Kant has in effect presupposed subjectivism, determining in advance that metaphysical knowledge will be found to be impossible. What is needed is a second dissociation, this time from the subject. In other words, we must stake ourselves in the inquiry, allowing not only our conception of the object of knowledge but also who we are to be transformed in the course of the inquiry, even leaving it open whether there will in the end be any subject for us to be. (228-9, 237-8)

Naturally, this interpretive tour de force raises further questions. Does the body of the Phenomenology live up to the promises made in the Introduction? Can we ever be sure that we have reached the stability of object-concept correspondence? Must we not be eternally vigilant against the complacent delusion of stability?

Bristow's book is a brilliant defence of Hegel, indispensable reading for anyone interested in Kant and Hegel, and in Kantian and Hegelian themes in contemporary philosophy. It also presents a breathtaking vision of epistemology. We should be grateful to Bristow, both for putting the long-standing debates between Kantians and Hegelians on a new footing, and for reminding us that Hegel -- whose sobriety, even as a student, won him the nickname "the old man" -- could nevertheless turn philosophy into an enterprise in which everything is risked, an adventure in which there is both terror and exhilaration.

[1] Hegel, Enzyklopädie der philosophischen Wissenschaften, §41, Zusatz 2, in Theorie Werk-Ausgabe, eds. Eva Moldenhauer and Karl-Markus Michel (Frankfurt: Suhrkamp, 1970), 8: 116. See Hegel, The Encyclopedia Logic, trans. T. F. Geraets, W. A. Suchting, and H. S. Harris (Indianapolis, IN: Hackett, 1991), 83.

[2] Karl Ameriks, "Hegel's Critique of Kant's Theoretical Philosophy", Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 45 (1985), 1-35, reprinted in Ameriks, Kant and the Fate of Autonomy (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2000), 267-308; Paul Guyer, "Thought and Being: Hegel's Critique of Kant's Theoretical Philosophy" in Cambridge Companion to Hegel, ed. Frederick Beiser (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1993), 171-210.

[3] See Hegel, Theorie Werk-Ausgabe, 2: 245: "The essence of dogmatism consists in this that it posits something finite, something burdened with an opposition (e.g., pure Subject, or pure Object, or in dualism the duality as opposed to the identity) as the Absolute." See Hegel, "On the Relationship of Skepticism to Philosophy", trans. H. S. Harris, in Between Kant and Hegel, eds. George di Giovanni and H. S. Harris (Indianapolis, IN: Hackett, 2000), 335.

[4] See Bristow, 43-8 on Critique of Pure Reason, B149, A155/B194, A240/B299, and B307-8.

[5] Kant, Prolegomena, in Kants gesammelte Schriften (Berlin: Walter de Gruyter, 1900-), 4: 354-5.

[6] See Ameriks, "Hegel's Critique", 24/297, discussed in Bristow, 43.

[7] Critique of Pure Reason, B190.

[8] Here I envisage an account of thought's directedness to objects that will be in conversation with Gareth Evans, Varieties of Reference, ed. John McDowell (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1982) and related literature.

[9] For a rare attempt to take Hegel's claim to presuppositionlessness seriously, see Stephen Houlgate, Hegel, Nietzsche and the Criticism of Metaphysics (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1986), An Introduction to Hegel: Freedom, Truth, and History (Oxford: Blackwell, 1991; revised edition, 2005), and The Opening of Hegel's Logic: From Being to Infinity (Lafayette, IN: Purdue University Press, 2006).

[10] Bristow, 218, modifying Miller's translation.

[11] As Bristow points out, this is how J. N. Findlay reads the section in his comments on Miller's translation. See Hegel, Phenomenology of Spirit, trans. A. V. Miller (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1977), 506.

[12] Far from minimal, however, is the claim that "the serial progression" of shapes of consciousness is "necessarily fixed". But this is "something contributed by us" (§87), not something immanent to natural consciousness. Does this undermine the claim to presuppositionlessness? Clearly, Hegel believes that he is writing at a time that is ripe for the birth of philosophical science, and that he and his contemporaries can therefore occupy a standpoint from which the series of shapes can be arranged in a necessary progression. However, this is not so much a presupposition as a wager on modernity: if he is right, then the Phenomenology will find its audience; if he is wrong, then it will remain at best "the esoteric possession of a few individuals." (§13)