Hegel, Deleuze, and the Critique of Representation: Dialectics of Negation and Difference

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Henry Somers-Hall, Hegel, Deleuze, and the Critique of Representation: Dialectics of Negation and Difference, State University of New York Press, 2012, 289pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781438440095.

Reviewed by Jim Vernon, York University


There is almost an inverse proportion between the importance of the clash between the philosophies of Hegel and Deleuze for contemporary Continental philosophy, and the amount of scholarship dedicated to it. While the explicitly anti-Hegelian nature of his work demands that Deleuzeans engage with Hegel to some degree, all too often this engagement remains strictly within the purview of Deleuze's critique, and thus is limited to schematic overviews, brief asides or even dismissive caricatures. On the other side, there has been even less engagement by Hegelians with Deleuze, which is curious given the voluminous literature responding to the critiques of related figures like Derrida and Bataille. Neither simply disdainful of Hegel, nor wholly convinced by Deleuze, in this rich, wide-ranging volume, Henry Somers-Hall offers what is assuredly the most comprehensive and important treatment of their varied and complex relations to date.

The uniqueness and strength of his approach is to treat the pair as offering incommensurable, but serious and compelling, responses to perceived limitations of Kant's critical philosophy. This allows him not only to place both thinkers decidedly on the 'post-Kantian' continuum, but also to frame his entry into their numerous works around a precise problematic, thus building towards common criteria for explicating and evaluating their radically distinct systems. While Deleuze receives the more substantial treatment, and eventually gains the upper hand over Hegel, Somers-Hall offers a balanced, erudite and immensely valuable analysis of both the merits, and potential limitations, of their respective philosophies of difference.

I should note that the book is in no way introductory. Readers unfamiliar with Hegel's system will likely have some difficulty navigating the relevant discussions. While the Deleuze chapters are generally more approachable, the book covers so much ground, through so many concepts and figures, that it will primarily be of value to those already well-versed in both thinkers as well as some of the literature surrounding them. This by no means a critique; the market is already overfull with substantial introductions to both Deleuze and Hegel, and any serious treatment of philosophers this comprehensive will of necessity draw from various and dense texts. It does, however, mean that the book does not lend itself easily to summary review. In what follows I will attempt simply to indicate the overall trajectory of the book, before offering a minor critique.

Kant's first Critique concerns itself with determining the structure of the objects of experience. His transcendental logic allows an empirical manifold, or multiplicity, to be grasped as a unified object, but only insofar as its unity is provided by the subject (via apperception). The transcendental ego synthesizes manifolds that remain distinct in kind from it, and thus its logic can only provide the a priori conditions for possible experiences, not the generative conditions for actual ones. "Kant's main preoccupation is therefore with the validity of propositions given in advance of our enquiry" (25), for it merely seeks the conditions for subjective knowledge of an object, which are presumed to be identical with the conditions of objects themselves.

As such, Kant's philosophy is one of 'finite representation', detailing the nature of which is the concern of Part 1 of this book. Philosophies of finite representation separate the logical relations constitutive of objects from the empirical multiplicities that fill them, or, more precisely, subsume manifolds of difference under distinct, subjective relations of identity. This representational logic is, thus, not unique to Kant, and in Chapter 2, Somers-Hall discusses its manifestation in the works of Aristotle and Russell (alongside shorter considerations of Aquinas and Zeno). In all of its forms, he argues, representation presupposes the validity of the subject-predicate form of judgment, which is independent of the content that fills it, and thus "creates a sharp divide between the form of thought and its subject matter" (56). Moreover, by conditioning all differences through a logical structure distinct from them, representation necessarily presents "limitations in the degree to which the world can be thought" (66). In particular, representational logic forecloses the possibility of determining the generation of specific differences out of its presupposed logical unity (as demonstrated, e.g., by the problem of the highest genus), and fails to capture the full range of empirically manifested differences within its clearly demarcated concepts (as demonstrated, e.g., by the problem of transitional differences, such as that between Socrates the boy and Socrates the man).

As Somers-Hall rightly shows, both Hegel and Deleuze develop their ontologies, at least in part, as a response to this static, one-sided interpretation of difference. Each, in their own way, seeks a path beyond finite representation that both includes all differences (by accounting for becoming, temporality, conceptual drift, etc.) and generates specific experiences (by accounting for the particular structures of the objects of actual experience). The nature of their alternate, divergent logics of difference occupies Part II, and much of Part III.

Rather than simply opposing or denying the representative field of discrete, 'actual' multiplicities, Deleuze supplements it with a transcendental, but subject-less 'virtual' field of continuous multiplicity. What is impressive about Somers-Hall's reconstruction of Deleuze's now well-known logic of difference is the sheer breadth of resources he marshals in order to clarify and defend it. Historically grounding Deleuze's account in philosophical developments made by Sartre (Chapter 1) and Bergson (Chapter 3), in Chapter 4 he uses non-Euclidean geometry, its application to dynamic systems theory and even an analogy to Merleau-Ponty's aesthetics to show how the virtual, despite operating according to a different logic, and therefore differing from them in kind, can both account for the appearance of representational actualities, as well as for the inherent limits of representational logic. While representation starts with a subjective structure presupposed to be isomorphic or identical to that of the objects differentiated under unity, Deleuze generates the structure of the object out of pure difference itself, determining both the a-subjective, differential ground of representation and the virtual, dynamic tendencies that inevitably transform it.

Chapter 5 argues that Hegel's Logic responds to the problem of finite representation by essentially developing a Kantianism without presuppositions. While Kant took for granted a necessarily finite subject to whom objects must appear, as well as a table of logical judgments applied to, rather than derived from an empirical manifold, Hegel seeks to provide an immanent deduction which provides "not just for a determination of the categories of thought but also of being" (134). That is, rather than presupposing either specific objects or determinate logical forms, Hegel simply takes "pure being, that which thought discloses, at face value and allow[s] being itself to determine" the structures through which it must be thought (135). In providing a purely immanent account of the development of thought through its generic objective content, Hegel shows how the various categories of logic sublate each other, turning contradiction into the motor that drives, rather than the problematic limit that haunts, representational thinking.

While both Deleuze and Hegel offer alternatives to finite representation, their approaches are mutually incompatible, in large measure due to their distinct diagnoses of the source of the problems with representation. Hegel, concerned primarily with representation's unjustified presupposition of the finite understanding as a fixed limit of both the thinking subject and the object thought, 'infinitizes representation' by showing how being's "inherent contradictions allow the categorical structure [of representation] to differentiate itself" (241). By placing contradiction, movement and becoming at the very heart of representational thinking, Hegel demonstrates that difference and identity mutually imply each other. Deleuze, by contrast, argues that "'good contradiction', in Hegel's sense, still relies on the prioritization of primary unity", which is the real problem with representation, and thus "circumscribes a domain of representation, pure actuality" within a transcendent, virtual field which provides the sub-representational, a-subjective conditions for the genesis of the finite (242). In a curious reversal of one common picture of their systems, Deleuze grounds the identical in the transcendence of the non-identical, while Hegel reconciles them in the immanently self-determining identity of identity and difference. Part III brings the pair into closer relation by exploring the application of their respective accounts of difference to the calculus (Chapter 6, which also includes a discussion of the Kantian antinomies), as well as the relationship between difference and opposition (Chapter 7, which uses Hegel's account of force and the 'inverted world' to consider the possibility that Deleuze's purely affirmative account of difference might result in a blandly accepting 'beautiful soul').

Having detailed -- better, I think, than anyone yet has -- their different logics of difference specifically as methods for overcoming the problems of representation, Somers-Hall concludes that "purely in terms of coherence, no decision is possible between Hegel and Deleuze" (243). Rather, he argues that the "ultimate test" for any such logic is "the extent to which [it] captures the nature of the world, not simply by ranging over all phenomena, but also by capturing their singularity" (210). As his test case, he takes up the problem of biological species (Chapter 8), and it is only here that a claim is made for the superiority of Deleuze's theory of difference to that of Hegel (or, more precisely, for the inferiority of Hegel's to that of Deleuze).

Hegel's organic ontology of self-differentiating identity/self-identifying difference clearly demands a non-mechanistic account of natural life. This he finds in a modified version of Kant's account of purposiveness, which he extends beyond the limits of the understanding to actualization in the world. This purposiveness is most adequately expressed by the animal "organism [which] consists in a set of parts that reciprocally determine one other in relation to a whole" but which, nevertheless and simultaneously, "is simply a product of the interaction of the parts" (219). Because the parts and whole in the animal organism reciprocally determine each other, species must necessarily differ from one another in kind (i.e., in accordance with a specific purposive unity of parts and whole) rather than in degree (i.e., in accordance with relative differentiations of shared forms and functions across species). As such, Somers-Hall argues, Hegel aligns his project with Georges Cuvier's teleological account of anatomy. Neither Cuvier nor Hegel, of course, deny the existence of deviations from the rigidly self-determining structure of species; but, given their purposive accounts, these are of necessity treated as monstrous aberrations from fixed forms, rather than as transversal developments of species. As such, Hegel's ontology of self-determining integration "implies a model of the organism as incapable of evolving" (243), and thus is essentially refuted by modern biology.

Deleuze's writings on biological life, by contrast, draw on Cuvier's great rival Geoffroy Saint-Hilaire, who "posited an underlying abstract structure for particular animal forms" in order to grant positive existence to 'deviant' intermediaries (225). Rather than categorically determining fixed species in accordance with their purposive functions, Deleuze thus posits a differential transcendental essence, or 'unity of composition', underlying them, which actualizes itself in diverse and shifting biological forms and relations. As such, his work "point[s] not only to the need to recognize the [merely] relative integrity of the organism" formed out of the transcendental field, but also to the fact that "the disintegration of the boundaries of the organism is an essential moment in the formation of organisms and species" (236). This does not necessarily mean Deleuze has offered the only compelling response to representation. In fact, Somers-Hall closes by suggesting that certain strains of phenomenology might offer an equally, or perhaps more compelling account of the genesis of representational actuality. But because "evolution operates both by requiring the existence of suboptimal organisms and by accepting that structure cannot be determined simply by function" (232), Deleuze's differential ontology, unlike Hegel's, remains compatible with the findings of modern biology, and thus at least endures as a prime contender for resolving the problems of representation.

While Somers-Hall's analysis of the organism in Hegel seems to me generally compelling, one might question its overall import for Hegel's theory of difference. The Philosophy of Nature has long been understood to be the most vulnerable part of Hegel's system and, arguably, the one least relevant to understanding the validity of his answer to the Kantian problematic. Nature, after all, finds its truth in Spirit, and thus it is only in the full range of specifically human activity that we see the self-determining concept reach its most adequate expressions. If Hegel is unable to admit natural evolution between biological species, he certainly articulates with rigor and subtlety the historical and ongoing developmental drift between seemingly distinct and rigid forms of state, culture, art, religion and philosophy. Just because Hegel saw nature as ultimately static does not mean his philosophy is fundamentally incapable of either accounting for, or indeed valorizing, progressive and open-ended development in other domains, or even in general. Comparing Hegel's more nuanced accounts of history, art or philosophy, with those of Deleuze might have made the contest between their philosophies of difference a bit more even.

Almost inevitably -- given the number of topics, texts, figures and arguments covered by the book -- I found myself at various times wishing that particular arguments had been pushed further, that specific claims had received more substantial defense, or that some lacunae had been filled. But Somers-Hall is in many ways breaking new ground here, and, more importantly, setting a new standard for treatments of the Deleuze/Hegel debate. This book is an essential reference for Hegelians and Deleuzeans working through the various challenges each thinker poses to the other, and a rewarding and recommended read for anyone interested in the ongoing development of Continental philosophy.