Hegel on Ethics and Politics

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Pippin, Robert B. and Hoffe, Otfried (eds.), Hegel on Ethics and Politics, Cambridge University Press, 2004, 340pp. $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521818141.

Reviewed by Sally Sedgwick , University of Illinois, Chicago


This volume collects under a single cover eleven post-war essays by German philosophers on Hegel’s social and political philosophy. With the exception of the contribution of Friedrich Fulda, which is a much-shortened version of his 1963 monograph, each of the essays has been previously published. Nicolas Walker has produced the translations for this volume.

The collection is published as part of the Cambridge University Press series “The German Philosophical Tradition.” A blurb on the front piece announces that the aim of the series is to make available to the Anglo-American philosophical community “important recent work by German philosophers on major figures in the German philosophical tradition.” The editors have selected essays of top quality, some of which have had considerable impact on Hegel studies in Germany. They are, in general, quite technical – not suitable either for a general audience or for beginners in the subject. Some of the papers (by Fulda and Henrich, for instance) are pretty dense and heavy (dare I say “Germanic”?). But even those that try the reader’s patience are well worth careful study. I admit to being daunted by the task of trying to convey in so few words the interest of each of these essays. All I can do here is indicate something of their content and occasionally draw attention to strengths and weaknesses.

Following the informative introduction to the volume by Pippin, the editors have included two “overview” papers. Both explore Hegel’s puzzling claim, expressed in the Preface to the Philosophy of Right, that “what is actual is rational, and what is rational is actual.” As Hans Friedrich Fulda puts it in his piece “The Rights of Philosophy,” if philosophy on Hegel’s account “cannot transcend the substantial content of its time,” how can it ground versus merely reflect the norms that happen to be actual (37)? Fulda rightly tells us that philosophy, for Hegel, is not content to “leave the state of the world to itself” (41). But Fulda gives us little help in understanding why Hegel considers himself justified in awarding a critical function to philosophical reflection. It does not clarify much to claim, as Fulda does, that even though Hegel is committed to the view that philosophy “cannot transcend the substantial content of its own time,” it nonetheless “stands above time in point of form” because it can “represent the thought of this content” (37). We need to know why the capacity to “represent the thought” of some content counts as genuinely critical.

Karl-Otto Apel’s piece, “Kant, Hegel, and the Contemporary Question Concerning the Normative Foundations of Morality and Right,” lobbies for his own pragmatic “transformation” of transcendental philosophy, his effort to combine the best insights of Kant and Hegel (49). This essay, like Fulda’s, is quite ambitious in scope. Apel first gives us an overview of his understanding of Hegel’s (entire) critique of Kant, and then moves on to provide a sweeping survey of his own program. For those interested in the motivations behind his effort to mediate between Kant and Hegel, this paper provides a good introduction. I had worries about Apel’s reading of Hegel, however. On page 72, he seems to attribute to Hegel the view that the identity of the rational and the actual is an ideal posited in advance by reason (by Hegel?), an ideal we are waiting for history to realize. It seems to me more accurate to say that, for Hegel, at any age in history, a moment of the rational is already reflected in the actual. (For a more reliable discussion of this topic, see Ritter’s contribution.)

The remaining papers provide somewhat more focused discussions of particular aspects of Hegel’s social and political philosophy. In “’The Personality of the Will’ as the Principle of Abstract Right: An Analysis of §§ 34-40 of Hegel’s Philosophy of Right in Terms of the Logical Structure of the Concept,” Michael Quante explains the sense in which Personality, for Hegel, is the most abstract of the three moments of the will. He helps us understand not just what Hegel takes to be deficient about this stage of the will, but also what motivates the progression beyond Personality in the Philosophy of Right.

In “Person and Property in Hegel’s Philosophy of Right (§§34-81),” Joachim Ritter explores Hegel’s argument, also in the Abstract Right section of the Philosophy of Right, that human freedom is actualized in the person’s right to things, the right to property. In addition to holding that freedom requires our objectification of nature, Ritter points out, Hegel also anticipates some of Marx’s concerns about the negative impact of that objectification (111). This essay both demystifies Hegel’s argument for the right to property and contains some of the best discussion in the collection of Hegel’s account of the standpoint of philosophical reflection in relation to the realm of the actual.

Manfred Baum directs our attention to the third and final section of the Philosophy of Right, the section “Ethical Life.” His discussion, in “Common Welfare and Universal Will in Hegel’s Philosophy of Right,” is especially helpful in illuminating Hegel’s portrayal of the nature of civil society. On Hegel’s characterization, one promotes the purposes of society as a whole, in civil society, as a means of promoting one’s own purposes (135). Civil society is thus not ethical substance; it is not yet the state. Baum’s essay turns from exegesis to criticism when he raises doubts about Hegel’s suggestion that both Rousseau and Kant fail to clearly enough distinguish civil society and the state.

One of the finest examples of philosophical argumentation in the volume is Wolfgang Schild’s essay, “The Contemporary Relevance of Hegel’s Concept of Punishment.” The scope of Schild’s objective in this piece is more limited than that of many of the other authors in the volume; perhaps this in part explains why his effort is so effective. He offers us a measured defense of Hegel’s theory of punishment. At the basis of Hegel’s theory of punishment, Schild argues, is the idea of freedom. In committing crime, the criminal fails to recognize her victim as a person (as a free subjectivity and thus a bearer of right). But given that the criminal who acts is also a free subjectivity, crime is in effect a violation of the criminal’s own will (159). Punishment is thus justified, according to Hegel, as a means of honoring the free and rational aspect of the criminal. Punishment re-asserts the very right that the criminal tries to destroy (164).

In one of the two essays most directly critical of Hegel (Siep’s being the other), Siegfried Blasche argues that Hegel is not sufficiently sensitive to the contingent historical assumptions that inform his own understanding of the domains of the family, civil society and the state. In his compelling paper “Natural Ethical Life and Civil Society: Hegel’s Construction of the Family,” Blasche claims that Hegel oversimplifies matters in telling us that, within the state, the family develops into (and is thus historically prior to) civil society. Rather, the family Hegel describes in Ethical Life does not exist in the absence of modern civil society as a precondition. The family can only fulfill the natural ethical function Hegel awards it once civil society is in place, once the business of satisfying needs is relegated to the system of needs (in civil society). Even Hegel’s portrayal of the modern subjectivity presupposes civil society at its basis, according to Blasche. Only the subject who is free of the responsibilities of traditional family life is in a position to pursue his own interests and determine his own will (194). A historically contingent conception of civil society thus serves to ground Hegel’s account of the family and of modern subjectivity.

In “The Role of Civil Society in Hegel’s Political Philosophy,” Rolf-Peter Horstmann gives us an account of the development of Hegel’s political theory, beginning with the 1802 essay on natural law. In his paper we encounter once again the problem of sorting out Hegel’s “reactionary” versus “progressive” tendencies. Horstmann provides a nuanced and measured discussion of this problem; he does not try to suggest that there is a simple solution to it. This paper is interesting to compare with that of Blasche since, in contrast to Blasche, Horstmann emphasizes Hegel’s arguments for the primacy of the state over all other forms of ethical life.

Like Horstmann, Ludwig Siep is worried about non-liberal and non-democratic elements in Hegel’s political philosophy. In “Constitution, Fundamental Rights, and Social Welfare in Hegel’s Philosophy of Right,” Siep highlights two grounds for concern. He is concerned, first, about Hegel’s denial that there can ever be any truly independent check, any set of norms outside the state, with which we can assess its legitimacy. He is concerned, second, about the fact that the historical process that is supposed to determine which actual norms get codified in the form of a constitution is, for Hegel, a process in which not all are allowed a voice. Siep reminds us, for example, that Hegel rejects the idea of a legislative assembly based on elections. (269). Siep’s conclusion is that Hegel’s system lacks the resources to sufficiently protect the rights of individuals from abuses of the state (287). (Here I cannot resist suggesting that the reader compare Siep’s perspective with that of the American Hegelian, George Armstrong Kelly, in his 1976 Polity paper, “Politics and Philosophy in Hegel.”)

The final section of the collection contains two of its richest contributions. Both explore what might be referred to as the logic of the Philosophy of Right. How are we to think about the relations holding among the various stages or moments in Hegel’s account of the development of right? As Dieter Henrich argues in his now classic paper “Logical Form and Real Totality: The Authentic Conceptual Form of Hegel’s Concept of the State,” Hegel does not intend us to understand the progression from stage to stage in straightforwardly causal terms. We thus err, for example, if we think of the state, on Hegel’s conception, as the mere effect of some agreement or contract among members of civil society. If the state is said to emerge somehow from civil society, it does so, Henrich argues, as a “formal implication” or “syllogistic conclusion” (246). The state, for Hegel, is the ground without which the needs and free activity of humans in civil society cannot be sustained. In Henrich’s words, the modes of civil society “can emerge properly only within the systematic political body in its actuality as a whole” (248). Hegel’s discussion of the state occurs in the final pages of the text, but the state has priority in so far as it sustains abstract right, morality, the family and civil society.

Henrich has little patience for those who discover in Hegel’s political system the view that individual freedom gets sacrificed in the service of the whole (263). What a proper understanding of the logical structure of the text reveals, according to Henrich, is that the whole both sustains and must be sustained by its parts. Hegel holds that the state “rests on the self-consciousness of subjectivity.” He wishes us to accept an implication of this assumption, namely, that the state’s institutions must “be sustained and activated by that subjectivity” (264).

In his fascinating paper, “Hegel’s Organicist Theory of the State: On the Concept and Method of Hegel’s ’Science of the State’,” Michael Wolff explores Hegel’s claim that the state is an “organic totality.” The idea of organic totality implies a particular logic of part/whole (particular/universal) relations. Wolff explains the logic of organic unity in this way: For Hegel, he writes, “the state could properly be regarded as an organism only to the extent that it is a whole articulated in its parts, one where the whole and parts causally determine one another with respect to their form and interconnection” (317f). The earlier stages of right, for Hegel, also may be understood in terms of the logic of their particular part/whole relations. Building on a thesis he attributes to Henrich, Wolff relies on Hegel’s doctrine of syllogistic forms to make explicit the logic of the various phases of right in the Philosophy of Right. If we take into account the different logical relations that can obtain between the terms universal, particular, singular (i.e., the different syllogistic forms), we can explain the progressions in the text from one stage of right to the next. The state is an organic totality in that it is only in the state that the relation between particular and universal is that of reciprocal determination. (As Wolff points out, Hegel relies for his notion of organic totality on Kant’s discussion in the Critique of Judgment (esp. §§ 77-79).) This is an extraordinarily impressive paper. Both this essay and Henrich’s are essential reading, especially for those convinced that Hegel’s political theory can be comfortably dissociated from his logic.