Hegel's Critique of Kant: From Dichotomy to Identity

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Sally Sedgwick, Hegel's Critique of Kant: From Dichotomy to Identity, Oxford University Press, 2012, 240pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199698363.

Reviewed by Katerina Deligiorgi, University of Sussex


Hegel's Critique of Kant amply rewards the patience of those who have been eagerly awaiting a book-length treatment of the position Sally Sedgwick has been developing over a number of years through her engagement with classical German philosophy. The book offers an original thesis with characteristic clarity, fine conceptual articulation and an expository style that combines the virtues of immanent interpretations with those of reconstructive ones.  Careful reading of the primary texts is put to the service of showing what is true in our philosophical past.

The book has three aims. The first is to show that a widely shared view of Hegel as an inattentive or unfair reader of Kant should be revised; the second that Hegel's criticisms are philosophically well-founded; and the third that the philosophical position Hegel develops in order to remedy the flaws he identifies in Kant is defensible. Obviously, the three are connected; given that Sedgwick is committed to the last two points, her view of Hegel's position naturally guides her reconstruction and interpretation of how Hegel reads Kant. This is not to say that this is a parti pris reading, and this is where attention to the texts pays off. I think Sedgwick largely succeeds in her first aim; the Introduction alone is a compact master-class of how to get fresh insights out of well-worn topics such as Kantian formalism in ethics. The pay-off for looking more closely and more sympathetically at Hegel's criticisms is a novel interpretation of the Kant-Hegel relation developed in detail in the rest of the book. Sedgwick argues that it is Hegel's modest estimation of our powers of abstraction that motivates his criticism of Kant (5, 6). She also thinks that it is Hegel not Kant who got our measure right. Although I found reading this section of the book extremely rewarding, I was not convinced simply because, in sharp contrast to the exemplary prosecution of the critical argument, the positive Hegelian alternative looks rather sketchy. In what follows I shall focus on a small part of her argument that is nonetheless illuminating for the whole, her treatment of the topic of intellectual intuition.

Kant's denial that our understanding is intuitive is a direct consequence of his view concerning the constitution of our cognitive capacities: 'An understanding, in which through self-consciousness all the manifold would at the same time be given, would intuit; ours can only think, and must seek the intuition in the senses' (B 135).[1] Hegel glosses this Kantian position as follows: 'the concept is permanently conditioned by a manifold of intuition'.[2] The alternative Hegel defends is that the 'concept . . . through a dialectic immanently grounded in it passes over into reality, which it generates [erzeugt] out of itself'.[3] This relation of thought to sensuous existence, Hegel continues, is already to be found in Kant's philosophy in the idea of 'an intuitive understanding'. Many readers of Hegel encounter the claim that our understanding is intuitive with incredulity since it appears to endow us with extraordinary powers. The topic is therefore central to Sedgwick's demonstration of the modesty and plausibility of Hegel's position. Although the debate about intellectual intuition belongs to the earlier stages of Hegel's engagement with Kant (and indeed the earlier stages of post-Kantian idealism), she is right to tackle the topic head on since Hegel's argument against Kant's two sources view of human cognition remains consistent throughout his mature writings even as his positive use of Kantian terminology becomes less frequent. Sedgwick admits that Hegel's rejection of the two sources view and his statements concerning our possession of an intuitive understanding gives the impression that he believes that we can produce objects simply by thinking them (43). She sets out to correct this impression by arguing that there are features of the Kantian notion of the intuitive intellect that Kant failed to acknowledge and which do describe an alternative model of cognition that is recognisably human and more plausible than the two sources view.

Sedgwick starts with an uncontroversial claim, that Kant's primary concern in the first Critique was to save reason from the quarrels of metaphysics by strictly regimenting which metaphysical claims have legitimate right to our assent and which do not, basically by allowing substantive a priori knowledge to be about appearances only. She then argues that the discursivity thesis, and therefore the two sources view of human cognition, flows directly from that primary concern. This is the connection she draws: on good Kantian grounds, failure to acknowledge discursivity leads to irresolvable conflicts or antinomies, while acknowledging discursivity, and so limits to our form of knowledge, invites 'consideration of objects from two points of view: from the standpoint of human understanding and knowledge, and from the standpoint of what is merely thinkable for us but capable of being known by a non-discursive or intuitive understanding' (35). Kant clearly considers what he calls the 'two-fold standpoint' (Bxvi) to be an advantage, since, as he says in the B-Preface cited here by Sedgwick, it allows reason to avoid self-conflict. A fallout from the discursivity thesis is the contingency of the 'discursive intellect's efforts to know' (22). If our intellect is discursive then its content must be independently given, but independence works both ways: the organisation of the understanding obeys its own rules and as a result, the conceptualisation of the independently given manifold is contingent. As Sedgwick puts it, if the form of experience is contributed by the knowing subject then 'we have no grounds for supposing that it reveals the reality of the given sense content itself' (136). It is to avoid this sceptical conclusion that Hegel sets out to defend a different model of cognition.

It is important to distinguish here between what is and what is not at stake in the contingency problem that Sedgwick identifies because this directly affects the positive claims she attributes to Hegel. She gives an indication early on when she quotes from the third Critique to the effect that concepts concern merely the 'possibility of an object' and they allow cognition of actually possible (rather than merely logically possible) objects by their restriction to sensible intuitions (21). There are at least two ways of understanding what Hegel is saying here.

One way of interpreting Hegel's claims about the importance of a non-contingent relation between the intellect and 'the laws in nature's products'[4] is as a direct challenge to the Kantian view of metaphysical necessity, a species of necessity that is vindicable a priori and attaches to the minimal set of properties of what could be instantiated in the physical universe. This is a broad conception of necessity that is not reducible to logical necessity, nor does it reflect natural necessity that is, real features in the world, for if it did, then reason would be legislating for nature. If we see Hegel as responding to this portion of Kant's argument, then he might be making a suitably narrow point, namely that there are natural necessities that adequately capture metaphysical necessities, which is another way of saying that we can have knowledge of the essential properties of things. I say this is a narrow point because how the notion of essential properties is further specified is open, but it should be clear that if the point of contention is Kant's conception of metaphysical necessity, this need not lead to any revision of the constitution of our cognitive powers.

There is another way of interpreting the contingency problem, as a problem about reference. On the Kantian picture, the senses provide the content to our intuition. But intuitions by themselves are 'blind', that is to say, mental content does not intrinsically refer, reference of course requires that we stand in some causal relation to objects (what Kant calls 'ground'), but we cannot attach mental content to objects unless we form judgements. Judgements use concepts, so concepts are what secures reference. On this view of the contingency problem, Hegel would be seeking to hold onto this last feature of Kant's thought, explicating how concepts refer by incorporating judging into practices, while giving up as idle the part about mental content. Again this need not lead to a reappraisal of our cognitive powers but merely the contextualisation of their employment in terms of, for example, a 'space of reasons, as a historically constituted human practice, [that] is autonomous, sui generis, not explicable in first-nature terms, not supernatural, subject to revision and critical correction'.[5]

Although at different points, Sedgwick's argument shares premises with the diagnoses of the problem of contingency given above, her concern overall is with rethinking the relation of understanding and intuition in order to show that intuitions and concepts 'stand to each other in a relation similar to that of the parts and the whole of an organism' (70). To say with Hegel that our understanding is intuitive is therefore not to seek to reduce concepts to intuitions or the other way round (111, 114). The problem of contingency, and so of skepticism, on Sedgwick's account, arises from our treating the understanding 'as wholly independent of and undetermined by nature' (94). Instead of the familiar hyperconceptualist Hegel then, Sedgwick offers us what looks like a naturalised Hegel. This resonates with Hegel's approbation for the model of organic unity for rational knowledge (63). The metaphor of organic unity fits Sedgwick's claim that on the Hegelian account our subjectivity is 'part of an original identity' (128). The question is what exactly this amounts to beyond the meta-philosophical claim that meta-philosophical enquiries such as the transcendental one are misguided because they seek to abstract universal validity from contingently valid content. Hegel denies that anyone has such abstractive powers; the laws of thought are not transparent to us (156, 161). But this does not explain how original identity works out in practice. One, conceptually and historically, available option is Spinozism, which Sedgwick does not countenance (or discuss). So we are left with a minimal positive characterisation of our cognitive powers as capable of knowing nature in itself, because unconditioned by subjective forms (93), but also as a dependent (158), in the sense of activated through engagement with the world that makes up our 'common reality' (159). I find this intriguing but sketchy: since, as I tried to show in the variant interpretations of the contingency problem discussed above, this picture can fit a number of different views of how we think, what we think about, and what is our place in the world as thinking beings.

[1] The reference is to the Paul Guyer and Allen W. Wood translation 1998 for CUP

[2] The reference is to the A. V. Miller translation 1969 for Gorge Allen, p. 589. The translation of Begriff as concept comes from George di Giovanni's translation 2010 for CUP.

[3] See both Miller 591-592, di Giovanni 522.

[4] W. Cerf and H.S. Harris trans., Faith and Knowledge SUNY Press 1977, p.88.

[5] Robert B. Pippin, 'Leaving Nature Behind: or Two Cheers for Subjectivism' in Nicholas H. Smith ed., Reading McDowell. On Mind and World Routledge, 2002, pp.58-75, here p.70.