Hegel's Critique of Metaphysics

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Béatrice Longuenesse, Hegel's Critique of Metaphysics, Cambridge University Press, 2007, 268pp., $89.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521844666.

Reviewed by Terry Pinkard, Georgetown University


One of the issues facing any study of Hegel's Logic has to do with one of the most contested themes in the current Hegel revival: Just what is Hegel's philosophical relation to Kant (and by implication Hegelianism's relation to the great Kant revival itself of the last several years)? It is a big, almost unmanageable question, but it is a good sign that one of the most influential people in Kant-studies has now finally published in English her study of Hegel's Logic. Those who have admired Béatrice Longuenesse's book on Kant will find equally as much to admire here; along with her usual insight and close attention to detail, there is also her ability to write and think clearly on demandingly abstruse topics in a highly readable way. As always, there is also much more to a book like this than a reviewer can even suggest. I will have to confine myself to a few of the highlights.

Although at first glance Longuenesse's book might look like only a limited study of a limited part of only one section of Hegel's system (the doctrine of reflection in the section of Hegel's Logic called "Essence"), she in fact has much larger goals in its sight. Longuenesse begins with a focus on Hegel's well known claim in the Phenomenology that the task of Hegel's philosophy is to show how "substance" must become "subject." There is a traditional reading of this claim which holds that this means that we must conceive of the underlying "substance" of the world as something more like a kind of monist holism that sees reality as a whole (a totality), which is itself to be conceived as something along the lines of a cosmic mind developing itself (and is thus usually identified with God). Very sophisticated versions of this more traditional view have recently appeared from Frederick Beiser and Paul Franks. This traditional reading has been subjected to quite a bit of criticism from what is called the "post-Kantian" interpretation (or sometimes, somewhat misleadingly, the "non-metaphysical" interpretation) of Hegel. Longuenesse's interpretation belongs mostly to the latter camp, but her post-Kantian Hegel is post-Kantian with a difference.

For Hegel, the goal of philosophy is to attain the true, i.e., the "absolute," that is, the "agreement between the act of thinking and what it purports to think: the agreement of the Concept and its object." (p. 27) However, Hegel claims that since on Kant's own terms, "thought knows only determinations that are themselves thought," it follows that "the only possible meaning of the thing-in-itself" must be that it is "the truth which thought gives itself as a norm," but which it "cannot attain." (p. 26) How then is thought to think of itself and its norms? The answer comes with a Spinozist twist: Thought thinking about itself is like Spinoza's natura naturans, whereas thought that has thought about itself is like Spinoza's natura naturata. This Spinozist link is brought out all the more clearly at the end of the book, where Longuenesse argues that whereas for Spinoza, absolute necessity is the modality of natura naturata (the infinite sequence of the modes) as identical with natura naturans, for Hegel, absolute necessity is the modality of the "thought [which has been] thought … as identical to thinking thought (form, reflection)." (p. 155) It is when this identity of "thought" and "the object which has been thought" makes itself conscious of itself that the category of substance receives its true signification: Substance turns out to be reflection "as" substance, or substance "as" reflection, the point of view of the totality on itself.

"Reflection therefore appears as the engine that moves the Logic forward in its entirety." (p. 34), and the Kantian idea of unifying a manifold of intuition in concepts thereby becomes in Hegel's treatment, "the back-and-forth movement between the unifying function of thought and the objective determinations that resist this unity" (p. 35), that is, the unification of the content that thought has already unified together with its ongoing activity of unification. This movement in the Logic is propelled by its facing up to its own contradictions in carrying this program out, contradictions which "express the confrontation between the movement of the self-determination of thought and the determinations it 'finds' before itself, or rather within itself, as a non-unified multiplicity." (p. 40) Thought is thus always attempting to get beyond itself, to its "other," and this impels thought's self-movement as it runs into the roadblocks that it sets up for itself and which it then reintegrates into itself. As Longuenesse summarizes this point: "What Hegel presents us is not a confrontation between a subject bearing rational forms of thought and a given (un-thought) object, but a confrontation of the two poles of thought itself." (p. 114)

In fact, Hegel is drawing on both Spinozist and Aristotelian themes to make his points. Longuenesse has what is surely the best full account of how actuality -- Wirklichkeit, which Hegel identifies with Aristotle's Energeia -- is one of the modal categories of this kind of thought (and is to be contrasted with possibility and necessity). Classical metaphysics thought of these modal categories as logical and ontological; Kant, on the other hand, thought of them as expressing a relation of existence to the cognizing subject. Hegel follows Kant in one respect -- the modal categories express only the "degree of unity between existence and a unified system of thought-determinations" -- but he also wants to hold that a category such as "actuality" characterizes existence, not just our relation to it. This follows from Hegel's rejecting any kind of "world of the beyond"; what is actual or possible is "existence in the context of a specific position and figure of thought with respect to existence." (p. 119) The older, by now discredited picture of Hegel as the man who thought he could "think" all the aspects of the world is, of course, perfectly at odds with this conception of modality. The modal category of contingency is just what cannot be rationally deduced, and when two contrary things are possible, one "invokes the authority of the real … in order to resolve the contradiction reflection is powerless to resolve." (p. 126)

Nonetheless, even though this might dispel some worries about Hegel's thought and reclaim his post-Kantian credentials, one must wonder, as Longuenesse herself notes, about what happens to all of Hegel's rather triumphalist talk of "necessity." The answer is that if the dialectic is fundamentally between thought as active and what is "given" to thought as material for its activity (even when that "given" is itself the earlier result of reflective thought), then the dialectic must move forward until it has, as it were, exhausted the "given" and there is nothing more for it to do. This end-point would be "absolute necessity," the point at which 'the thinking' and 'what is thought' are identical (p. 155). This would be substance -- which has already turned out to be a category of reflection itself -- taking a point of view on itself as reflecting. That is, it would turn out to be what Hegel calls "the concept." In turn, this would constitute freedom itself, since it would be the pure spontaneity of the concept which, in reflecting on itself, realizes its freedom. For Hegel, freedom is just that "of the self-developing concept," "the absolute necessity of thought that designs necessity in things," the "freedom of the same inexorable thought that is the source of all necessity." (p. 157)

Longuenesse ends her study of "reflection" in the Logic with the admonition that one can turn Hegel into a dogmatic rationalist only if one also ignores how Hegel's theory of the "concept" emerges out of the logics of "Being" and "Essence." However, whereas this first part of her book is critical of but nonetheless sympathetic to Hegel, the last two chapters are, as one might put it, sympathetic but much more critical. The title of Part II fairly well sums things up: "Point of View of God or Point of View of Man." The title arises first out of Hegel's criticism of Kant. To sum up (admittedly, all too quickly) Longuenesse's point at the end of the first part of her book: Because Kant gives the empirical object an existence independent of the subject (but only as a representation), any agreement of the object and the unity of the "I think" can only come about by introducing the "point of view of God" (p. 145). Thus, the stereotypes of Kant as the prudent anti-metaphysician and Hegel as the wild-eyed rationalist are partially upset: "Hegel attributes solely to reflection a unity that Kant attributes to divine intelligence." (p. 146)

However, in the last two chapters, Longuenesse comes back to this theme to argue that, all things said and done, it turns out to be Hegel who argues from the "point of view of God" and not Kant, who, with his emphasis on receptivity, argues from the point of view of man. Both of these emerge by reflection on two other Hegelian texts. One is the text of 1802, "Faith and Knowledge" (predating the 1807 Phenomenology), and the other is a short study of Hegel's doctrine of judgment in his mature Science of Logic.

What Hegel was trying to do in 1802 was both to provide a reorganization of all of Kant's three Critiques and to use the first and third Critiques to criticize the second one. In the second Critique, Kant claimed that reason in its practical use was unconditioned -- it was itself unconditioned (not being in debt to sensibility in its practical employment), and it provided unconditional duties. It was this concept of practical reason that drew Hegel's critical eye since he saw it as the perfect expression of Kant's "finite" (point of view of man) standpoint.

Any quick reading of Hegel's criticisms of Kant on this point make his views look rather weak. It looks as if Hegel is only rejecting Kant's claims and endorsing some version of "intellectual intuition" which Kant had, with good reason, ruled out. However, things are not quite that simple. What Hegel is picking up on is Kant's own assertion in the first Critique that "the same function which gives unity to the various representations in a judgment also gives unity to the mere synthesis of various representations in an intuition, and this unity, in its most general expression, we entitle the pure concept of the understanding." (A79=B105) What would this function be? In 1802, Hegel said that insofar as the transcendental imagination is the source of the unity of intuition, and insofar as the unity of apperception, as the transcendental imagination, is therefore at work in intuition, the unity of apperception must be the "original unity" out of which the "duality" of both concepts and intuitions emerges. (Heidegger later made a similar claim about the transcendental imagination to make an entirely different point by identifying it with temporality.) What gives the misleading air to Hegel's text is that he seems to have used "intellectual intuition" to mean what Kant meant by "reason," but once that kind of misunderstanding is avoided, it becomes clear that Hegel is on to something important about how deeply Kantian spontaneity goes into Kantian receptivity on Kantian terms themselves.

Hegel extends this thought into his reconstruction of Kant's table of judgments. The same basic idea -- an original unity that splits itself up into moments to be re-established later -- is at work there. Hegel's criticism of Kant thus turns out to be that even practical reason -- which Kant took to be unconditioned in its product and in itself -- is itself "just as phenomenal as his theoretical reason" because, as involving a duality that is itself grounded in a deeper unity, it is finite. (p. 189) What Longuenesse at the very end of her book calls this "astonishing shift in the definition of the rational" is itself required by the Hegelian "process by which the concept tends towards its own accomplishment." (p. 216)

At this point, Longuenesse admits that despite his now well-established post-Kantian credentials, Hegel still looks like the poster boy for the kind of rationalist metaphysics Kant thought he had forever put out of bounds, and that the more prudent choice for us might be finally to acknowledge as a "strange and grandiose novel" Hegel's own attempts at presenting his post-Kantian system. (p. 217) Rather than bite the Hegelian bullet, Longuenesse instead calls for a retreat back to Kant, to look back (as Hegel had done) at all three Critiques and elucidate the more sober Kantian notion of "the point of view of man," namely, "the nature of the ever more complex ways in which sensibility and discursivity, passivity and activity are entwined in making possible our cognitive and practical access to the world." (p. 189)

Longuenesse's call for a new form of Kantianism which would let itself be provoked by Hegel but which would clearly adhere to the "point of view of man" sounds, of course, not unlike the brand of Neo-Kantianism developed by Ernst Cassirer (without Cassirer's residual formalism), and, if one grants a lot of interpretive latitude, maybe even the quasi-Kantianisms of Wilfrid Sellars and John McDowell. It is surely important to note that the book’s first part (on Hegel's doctrine of "reflection") was written before her book on the power of judgment in Kant, and that the last two chapters in her book on Hegel were written after the Kant book. Thus, her Kant book, her more recent collection of articles (Kant on the Human Standpoint), and the last two chapters of Hegel’s Critique of Metaphysics may be seen as answering questions that were implicitly posed by the first part of her book on Hegel. Longuenesse's more recent work goes further in developing her own brand of neo-"neo-Kantianism," but it takes some of its inspiration from non-Kantian sources, such as Merleau-Ponty. Will her new work be as Kantian? I suppose we will have to wait for that next book for the answer.