Hegel's Practical Philosophy: Rational Agency as Ethical Life

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Robert B. Pippin, Hegel's Practical Philosophy: Rational Agency as Ethical Life, Cambridge University Press, 2008, 308pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521728720.

Reviewed by Timothy Brownlee, Xavier University, Cincinnati


Robert Pippin's Hegel's Practical Philosophy is a book-length investigation of Hegel's conception of action and agency. Pippin claims that the distinguishing feature of actions for Hegel is that they are "the distinct sorts of events for which we may appropriately demand reasons or justifications from subjects whom we take to be responsible for such events occurring." (3) He goes on to argue that this conception of practical reason rests on a specific account of freedom, and the primary task of the book is to spell out the elements of Hegel's conception of freedom. In this sense, Hegel's Practical Philosophy provides a practical complement to the largely theoretical investigations of Pippin's earlier Hegel's Idealism,[1] and has the potential to be of equal importance for our understanding of Hegel. The book should prove to be a significant one not only for scholars of Hegel's practical philosophy, but also for those interested in German idealism more generally, the history of ethics and political philosophy, as well as philosophers interested in issues related to action and agency and contemporary political thought.

Indeed, one of the merits of Pippin's work is that, unlike some other treatments of the work of German idealists, and Hegel in particular, the book should prove accessible to non-specialists and those not initiated into the often perplexing vocabulary engineered in the wake of Kant's critical revolution in philosophy. At the same time, the work is not simply a narrative restatement of the central elements of Hegel's conception of freedom. Pippin indicates an admirable sensitivity to the argumentative significance of Hegel's stance, and he does much to situate that stance in relation to contemporary issues in the philosophy of action. He clearly intends the work to be not only of antiquarian interest, but actually to constitute something like a defense of Hegel's position. Of course, readers should not expect lengthy discussions of many questions central to mainstream discussions of the freedom of the will. While Pippin claims that Hegel rejects voluntarism, incompatibilism, and dualism in favor of a form of compatibilism, he also argues that Hegel takes issue with many of the ontological presuppositions at work in modern treatments of action ("the isolation of subjects as ontologically distinct individuals and of a subject's reasons as episodic or dispositional and perhaps uniquely causal mental states") and, for that reason, elements of the argument will no doubt appear to be heterodox. (9)

Most notable among those elements is Pippin's claim that, for Hegel, certain institutional and social conditions must be in place in order for an agent's will -- not only her acts -- to count as free. On Pippin's reading, Hegel holds a "relational state" theory of freedom, with two essential components, one psychological or subjective, and one social or objective. (12) On the subjective side, in order for an agent to be free, she must be able reflectively and deliberatively to identify as her own both (a) the purposes that her actions are to accomplish, and (b) the inclinations and incentives that motivate those actions. Pippin stresses that this subjective self-relation appeals to an experiential criterion to distinguish free from unfree acts. Because Hegel understands the will to be a form of thinking and not primarily a causal power, in order for the act to count as free, the agent must be able to experience and understand her own relation to the purposes her act promotes, as well as the act's motivating inclinations, in a non-alienated way. On Pippin's interpretation, this "is a matter primarily of comprehension or experiential understanding, and not at all the experience of a power successfully executed." (130) Pippin devotes some attention to demonstrating that while Hegel does not believe that practical reason alone can be motivating, this belief does not commit him to a merely instrumental "slave of the passions" conception of practical reason. Successful agency presupposes that the agent has, through reflection and deliberation, given a "rational form" to those (otherwise contingent and natural) inclinations that motivate her to act. For this reason, on Pippin's account, free acts are distinguished by the reason to which a subject might appeal in justifying them (Hegel identifies such reasons as "ethical" [sittlich]) and not, for example, because they are the effect of a particular species of cause.

Pippin argues that the real uniqueness of Hegel's conception of freedom falls on the objective side. On Pippin's reading, an agent can establish the relevant kind of subjective self-relation only if she already stands within institutional, norm-governed relations of reciprocal recognition to others. This objective element of free actions stems from the fact that Hegel understands justification to be a fundamentally social practice -- "the giving of and asking for reasons" by participants in a set of shared institutions. (24) Since it is the character of the agent's justifying reasons for her deeds that distinguish free actions from unfree ones, such justifying reasons will be simply those that are accepted by like-minded others. To argue for this point, Pippin defends a number of counter-intuitive ideas relating to individual responsibility that are central to Hegel's conception of agency. Since Hegel rejects the idea that being an agent means, first and foremost, being a cause of one's action, having an intention cannot simply consist in possessing a specific subjective state that produces a determinate action. Rather, according to Pippin, expressing an intention amounts to "avowing a pledge to act, the content and credibility of which remains (even for me), in a way, suspended until I begin to fulfill the pledge." (151) It is not until my intention is recognized by others and myself as being fulfilled or realized in my deed that I can identify my act as my own. Justification thus turns out to be more retrospective than prospective, a process in which, Pippin argues, the agent's own stance on her action is by no means authoritative. Being an agent -- being able to provide reasons to others to justify one's deeds -- is itself an "achieved social status such as, let us say, being a citizen or being a professor, a product or result of mutually recognitive attitudes." (155) On Pippin's account, Hegel's view is that rational norms are those that admit of mutual recognition -- those which can actually serve as justifications for actions within a community -- and he argues that the norms operative within the shared institutions of modern ethical life (Sittlichkeit) have this rational character. Hence, in addition to being essentially norm-governed, free agency is irreducibly intersubjective and institutional, and ultimately only possible within the specific social context of modern ethical life.

Pippin's account of Hegel's conception of freedom is both novel and challenging. One of the particular merits of this account lies in the original and compelling interpretation of the idea of spirit (Geist) operative in Hegel's writings. On Pippin's interpretation, "spirit" refers neither to an extra-natural immaterial substance nor to a "Divine Mind or Cosmic spirit" which appropriates human agents as vehicles for the accomplishment of its own purposes. (42) The distinction between nature and spirit does not, therefore, stem from the fact that spirit is a thing of a different kind from natural things (on Pippin's reading, spirit is "not a thing at all" [41]), but rather has more to do with the different sets of criteria that are required for explaining them. Glossing Hegel's claim that spirit is a product of itself to mean that spirit is "only what it takes itself to be," Pippin argues that spirit is rather "a kind of norm," "an achieved form of individual and collective mindedness, and institutionally embodied recognitive relations." (60, 62, 39) Spirit thus has a historical genesis, and Pippin argues that the specific theoretical and practical norms to which we subject ourselves are "self-legislated" through a social and historical process of institutionally-bound and recognitively-structured negotiation. (Pippin argues against an individualistic conception of self-legislation by means of an engagement with Korsgaard's interpretation of Kant in Chapter 3.) Likewise, this shared mindedness is not grounded in the self-realization of some natural or divine substance, but is rather sustained in practice through the collective, human activity of holding one another to norms. We achieve this "status" by treating others as beings who are responsive to reasons (as opposed to, say, sophisticated causal mechanisms or natural organisms).[2]

Pippin's account of recognition and of its political importance should prove to be of enduring significance. Pippin argues that, for Hegel, the primary importance of recognition lies not in its being a psychological good, nor in its contribution to the formation of a self or a social identity, but rather in the fact that intersubjective recognition is essential to being free. Pippin argues that intersubjective recognition, which is a significant issue for Hegel in the Jena writings on spirit and politics, and in the 1807 Phenomenology of Spirit, continues to play an ineliminable role in Hegel's later systematic treatments of freedom, most notably that of the "Sittlichkeit" chapter of the Philosophy of Right: "The ethical life theory is an account of successful recognition, or a mutuality based on a kind of rational acknowledgment." (185) Acknowledging this role of recognition in the constitution of agency indicates, Pippin argues, a shortcoming in modern liberal accounts of the state and of the authority of political norms, which presuppose a kind of "theoretical ultimacy of the human individual." (211) At the same time Pippin contends -- apparently against communitarian readings of Hegel's theory of ethical life -- that Hegel's politics do not require strong allegiance to a single, complete conception of the good, but rather bear much in common with liberal views.

Pippin's interpretation of the Philosophy of Right challenges those offered by Habermas, Theunissen, Hösle, and (in some ways) Honneth, all of whom claim that Hegel abandoned the conception of intersubjective recognition operative in the Jena writings in his later political thought. While I agree with Pippin's suggestion that we do not need to read the Philosophy of Right account of freedom as inconsistent with the earlier account of intersubjective recognition, there is insufficient textual evidence in the later works to establish the strong claim which he makes, namely that the central task of the Philosophy of Right is to provide "an account of successful recognition."[3] First, in the Phenomenology of Spirit, mutual recognition is not simply "posed and explored" as a "desideratum." (184) At the conclusion of Chapter 6 of that work, Hegel claims that we find a fully mutual recognition between the agent conscience and the hard-hearted judge.[4] Second, if Hegel intended the concept of recognition to be essential to the later account of right, he does a very poor job indeed of spelling this out. Pippin's approach to the Philosophy of Right proves much more successful if we understand it to be primarily reconstructive, rather than simply interpretive.

Within the Philosophy of Right, Hegel appears to ascribe to the concept of "right" a stronger organizing role than that which he assigns to recognition. However, Pippin downplays any suggestion that the two aspects of the concept of right which Hegel treats prior to the discussion of ethical life, those of "abstract right" and "morality," could play a foundational role in his account of freedom. While he is correct to point out that Hegel stresses that the free will conceived as "personhood" (as it is in abstract right) and as "subjectivity" (as it is in morality) are both "abstractions," and that they have "the ethical as their support and foundation,"[5] the specific sense in which we are to understand this remark is far from clear. This claim might simply indicate that "abstract right" and "morality" are abstract in the sense that they are "realized" only within specific (ethical) communities and conditions. Indeed, this is the point which Hegel stresses in §141A, where he indicates that these are merely incomplete "moments" of the concept of right, lacking "reality" or "actuality" outside of the ethical.[6] However, establishing that these notions are "abstract" in this way does not entail that they play a role similar to the other "concrete" determinations of ethical life which Hegel considers. Rather, identifying someone as a "person" or a "subject" seems to involve the deployment of a concept of a different kind than "sittlich", a concept like "father," "co-worker," or "citizen."

Rather than merely identifying "personhood" and "subjectivity" as components of our modern identify as free agents, Hegel ascribes a special argumentative role to "abstract right" and "morality" within the Philosophy of Right. We should take Hegel seriously when he suggests that a configuration of institutions and practices can count as ethical only if it can be demonstrated (the language of §141A is of "proof", "deduction", and "deducing") that freedom is realized therein:

The ethical is a subjective disposition, but it is specifically that of right existing in and for itself; -- that this idea is the truth of the concept of freedom cannot be a presupposition … but -- in philosophy -- can only be something proven. The deduction of this idea is comprised only of this, that right and moral self-consciousness show in themselves that they return to this idea as their own result.[7]

These specific notions of abstract right and morality appear themselves to play a sort of foundational role in the demonstration of the legitimacy of the institutions of ethical life. While I agree with Pippin that, from the practical perspective, one always deliberates "qua ethical being," and never purely or simply as person or subject, Hegel stresses here a unique role for philosophy in demonstrating that the normative demands of the institutions of modern ethical life are legitimate because those institutions constitute a configuration of right, that is, because they contribute to the realization of freedom. It is no doubt true that our concepts of personhood and moral subjectivity are themselves the products of a specific historical development, that "Only in some conditions, given some self-understanding, prompted by certain forms of social life, would coming to recognize each other as rights-bearers or moral individuals have some role to play in the ethical life of a people." (206-7) However, this historical claim is perfectly consistent with the idea that these concepts play a special role in the argument for the legitimacy of modern institutions which Hegel offers in the Philosophy of Right.

These issues aside, Pippin's book constitutes a unique and important contribution to the vibrant discussion of the central questions raised in Hegel's practical philosophy, and not only promises to be a significant work within Hegel studies, but also has the potential to be an important voice within contemporary debates in the philosophy of action and value theory.

[1] Robert B. Pippin, Hegel's Idealism: The Satisfactions of Self-Consciousness (New York: Cambridge University Press, 1989).

[2] This account of spirit is significant for Pippin's argument since he contends that understanding the systematic context of Hegel's ethical and political writings is necessary to understand his practical philosophy. The discussion of what spirit is, as well as his treatment of the logic or theory of the Concept operative in Hegel's conception of agency (Chapter 4), distinguish Pippin's work from other recent attempts to excise Hegel's practical philosophy from its broader systematic context. In different ways, Wood, Hardimon, and Neuhouser all adopt this interpretive strategy of removing Hegel's account of ethics and politics from their systematic and logical context in their works on Hegel's practical philosophy.

[3] While Pippin is careful to catalogue and interpret the specific discussions of recognition in the Philosophy of Right, he does not do enough to demonstrate that the recognition Hegel has in mind is, in each case, the intersubjective recognition of the Jena writings, and not, for example, the subject's recognition of the rational legitimacy of the objective institutions of her social world. For example, the "right of the subjective will," whose significance Pippin acknowledges for Hegel's account of right generally, does not demand that individuals recognize one another. Rather, it is the right according to which the will "should recognize as valid" that which can "be seen by it as good." G. W. F. Hegel, Grundlinien der Philosophie des Rechts, Theorie Werkausgabe 7, ed. E. Moldenauer and K. M. Michel (Frankfurt a.M.: Suhrkamp, 1970), p. 245, §132. This recognition is important for Hegel's account of the objective institutions of modern ethical life, since recognizing those as institutions make possible the realization of freedom that their goodness is to be demonstrated. As Hegel states in the "Preface," "Human beings think and, in thinking, they seek their freedom and the ground [Grund] of ethical life," and such thinking should seek that which is "universally recognized and valid [das allgemein Anerkannte und Gültige]." Philosophie des Rechts, pp. 14-5. However, aside from mentions of intersubjective recognition during specific discussions, in particular in the account of "civil society" (for example, in §192 and §253A), but also in the discussion of the state (in §260), there is little textual evidence to suggest that intersubjective recognition plays a central or foundational role in the Philosophy of Right.

[4] "Das Wort der Versöhnung ist der daseiende Geist, der das reine Wissen seiner selbst als allgemeinen Wesens in seinem Gegenteile, in dem reinen Wissen seiner als der absolut in sich seienden Einzelheit anschaut, -- ein gegenseitiges Anerkennen, welches der absolute Geist ist." Hegel, Die Phänomenologie des Geistes, Theorie Werkausgabe 3, p. 493, ¶670.

[5] Hegel, Philosophie des Rechts, p. 291, §141Z.

[6] Hegel, Philosophie des Rechts, p. 287, §141A.

[7] Hegel, Philosophie des Rechts, p. 287, §141A.