Hegel's Preface to the Phenomenology of Spirit

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Georg Wilhelm Friedrich Hegel, Hegel's Preface to the Phenomenology of Spirit, translation and running commentary by Yirmiyahu Yovel, Princeton University Press, 2005, 248 pp, $19.95 (hbk), ISBN 0691120528.

Reviewed by Paul Franco, Bowdoin College


Everyone knows the story of how Hegel, in October of 1806, against the backdrop of the battle of Jena, composed the final pages of the Phenomenology of Spirit with the roar of Napoleon's cannons in his ears. The Preface to the work, completed a few months later in January of 1807, reflects the revolutionary excitement of the time. Hegel writes there that it is "not hard to see that our time is a time of birth and transition into a new era. Spirit has broken away from its former world of existence and imaging; it is about to sink all that into the past, and is busy shaping itself anew" (82). The revolution that he speaks of is not merely political but also philosophical. Philosophy is in the process of transforming itself into a science, becoming actual wisdom instead of mere love of wisdom (71-72). It is to this revolutionary transformation that Hegel sees the Phenomenology as first and foremost contributing.

The Preface explains just what this transformation of philosophy into science fundamentally involves. In the first place, it involves the repudiation of the romantic notion, associated with Hegel's friends from the Tübingen Stift, Hölderlin and Schelling, that absolute truth can be grasped only in intuition or immediate feeling. In his younger days, Hegel shared with Hölderlin and Schelling the aspiration to overcome the dichotomies of Kant's critical philosophy, in particular its denial that we can have knowledge of the absolute or thing in itself. In the Phenomenology, Hegel does not abandon this aspiration, but he rejects Hölderlin's and Schelling's conception of absolute knowledge in terms of immediate intuition or feeling. Such a conception, he argues, dissolves the rich differentiation and determination of empirical content into a "night in which all cows are black" (94).

In contradistinction to this romantic conception, Hegel develops his own distinctive understanding of absolute knowledge as the product of a dialectical process of mediation and self-differentiation. The absolute is not to be found in the immediate apprehension of some primordial unity but only at the end of a process by which this immediate unity is negated and reflectively differentiated before being restored to identity. Hegel sums up his position by saying that "everything depends on comprehending and expressing the true not as substance, but equally also as subject" (95). That is to say, the absolute is not some sort of inert "thing" but the product of a subject-like process of self-positing, self-differentiation, and self-determination. To this process of cognitive self-development Hegel gives the name of "the concept."

All of this and more is laid out in vivid and magisterial fashion in the Preface to the Phenomenology, which makes it an ideal introduction to Hegel's philosophical outlook as a whole. Therefore, a new English translation of this seminal text, accompanied by a running commentary, is a welcome event. Yovel's translation aims to be accurate and straightforward, avoiding the literary embellishment and interpretive clarification that characterize other English translations of the Preface (for example, Baillie's and Miller's); and in this aim it succeeds admirably. The interpretation and clarification from which he abstains in his translation Yovel consigns to his substantial introduction and running commentary. Because this is where his distinctive contribution to the secondary literature on Hegel lies, I will devote the rest of my review to examining the argument described there.

Yovel states at the outset that his "interpretation tries to be faithful to the historical Hegel and reconstruct his ideas within their own context. I [have] abstained as much as possible from mixing my own philosophical preferences with my reading of Hegel" (xi). As a consequence, his reading does not -- as many other current readings do -- play down the metaphysical and ontological dimensions of Hegel's philosophy. Yovel differentiates his approach in this regard from two influential contemporary approaches. On the one hand, he rejects what he calls the "social Hegel" (associated with commentators such as Charles Taylor and Allen Wood), which separates Hegel's more fruitful political theory from his less fruitful ontology. Against this social reading, Yovel rightly argues that "one cannot adequately grasp the meaning of Hegel's social philosophy in separation from the specifically Hegelian ontology" (2). On the other hand, Yovel also rejects the post-Kantian, nonmetaphysical reading of Hegel (associated with commentators such as Klaus Hartmann, Robert Pippin, and Terry Pinkard), which sees Hegel's philosophy as an extension of Kant's idealist project rather than a relapse into precritical metaphysics. Yovel agrees with the post-Kantian reading that Hegel in no way seeks to return to the precritical metaphysics of substance, but he still sees Hegel as having substantial ontological commitments of his own.

What these commitments involve Yovel spells out through an analysis of the two most famous dicta of the Preface: "everything depends on comprehending and expressing the true not as substance, but equally also as subject" (95); and "the true is the whole" (102). With respect to the first, Yovel argues that it involves an ontological claim about the nature of being or reality, namely, that it is not static but develops in subject-like fashion by negating, differentiating, and positing itself. It is difficult not to see this, however, as a return to pre-Kantian metaphysics or at least to Schellingian pantheism. But Yovel further argues that being or reality has this subject-like character precisely because it is constituted by human activity and knowledge. It is spirit, not nature, that develops through negation, differentiation, and self-particularization. This seems right, but it also seems to blur the distinction between Yovel's "ontological" reading of Hegel and the post-Kantian, nonmetaphysical reading of Hegel he putatively rejects. If there is a weakness in Yovel's account, it is that it does not engage the issues raised by the post-Kantian reading of Hegel in sufficient detail or depth.

One of the most helpful things Yovel does in both his introduction and his commentary is to bring out the implicit targets of Hegel's polemical attacks in the Preface. The Phenomenology marks a crucial turning-point in the history of German idealism -- Yovel calls it "a document of divorce" (45) -- and in the Preface Hegel incisively highlights his fundamental differences with his predecessors Fichte, Schelling, and Hölderlin. I have already said something about Hegel's rejection of Schelling's and Hölderlin's romantic understanding of absolute knowledge in terms of intellectual intuition, but his criticism of Fichte's subjective idealism is equally important. Though Hegel credits Fichte with being the first to go beyond Kant's merely critical idealism and to establish philosophy on an absolute and scientific basis, he ultimately criticizes him for applying his principle of self-identity, the famous I=I, in a completely formalistic way. In Fichte, self-identity is merely "the shapeless recurrence of the same, which is applied externally to diverse materials," instead of "a richness that flows out of itself, and a self-determining differentiation of shapes" (90-91). In other words, Fichte conceives of the absolute as an abstract, rather than a concrete, universal.

Fichte, Schelling, Hölderlin, and Hegel all saw themselves as completing the revolution in philosophy inaugurated by Kant. To what extend did they succeed? In the final section of his introduction, Yovel considers this question specifically with respect to Hegel. Hegel's crucial departure from Kant lies in his rejection of the latter's insistence on the finitude of human reason. Yovel ultimately finds it hard to follow Hegel in this regard, siding instead with Kant's "more sober, profound, secular, and disillusioned view of the human (and modern) condition" (57). This judgment reflects the objectivity and evenhandedness of Yovel's approach to Hegel throughout the text. "A fair historian of philosophy," he writes, "must recognize that the metaphysics of absolute spirit was essential to Hegel's own project, even if it is incongruent with the aims of many who are otherwise deeply indebted to him" (57). If Hegel is to remain a vital and indispensable philosopher for us -- and Yovel believes he certainly should -- we must be careful to avoid his claims to absolute knowledge, to totality, infinity, and closure. "The result will be a free, historicized, and semidialectical philosophizing" that accepts "human finitude and contingency, the lack of a final synthesis." Such philosophizing may not correspond exactly to the historical Hegel, but -- as Yovel justly comments -- neither would it "have been possible without him" (61-62).