Hegel's Aesthetics: The Art of Idealism

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Lydia L. Moland, Hegel's Aesthetics: The Art of Idealism, Oxford University Press, 2019, 333pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190847326.

Reviewed by William Desmond, Villanova University


This very welcome book opens with the reminder that Hegel has been credited with being both the father of art history and the prophet of art's end. The first claim has ensured Hegel's place in art history as a discipline; the second controversial claim has guaranteed the longevity of Hegel's philosophy of art within the field of aesthetics. The combination of these two considerations constitutes a double irony, itself contributing to claim and counterclaim in the interpretation of the significance of Hegel's aesthetics. It has also meant that both analytic and continental philosophers, as well as art theorists, have continued to engage diversely with Hegel's philosophy of art. In all of this, no shared understanding has emerged concerning what Hegel means by the end of art. Lydia L. Moland's view is that lack of clarity in this regard also hinders our understanding of Hegel's idealism in general.

Moland's book is generally oriented to situating Hegel's philosophy of art within an understanding of his idealism, as well as oriented to making intelligible sense of the systematic form and determinate details of his lectures on aesthetics as a whole. Not only is Hegel's theory of art informed by his philosophical idealism, it allows us to understand his idealism better. It throws light on his theories of the senses, selfhood, perception, and recognition. Importantly also, Hegel's understanding of the development of art historically indicates how human beings have come to understand the nature of the divine and given it diverse imaginative expression. The point is central, and merits comment below. In addition, the book gives intelligent and attentive accounts of the particular arts: architecture as dealing with Hegel's understanding of articulated space; sculpture as dealing with spiritual, embodied individuality; painting, music, and poetry, each as dealing with the sensuous objectification of subjectivity and its inner life. Moland rightly points out that scholarship has often neglected much of the rich detail, to say nothing of systematic formation, of Hegel's discussion -- of music, for instance. She desires to respond to that neglect and does so well.

One might amplify the point: it is surprising that Hegel's aesthetic has suffered neglect in our own postmodern age, so-called, when the preeminence of the aesthetic is so marked, to the diminution of the religious, and the sterilization of the philosophical in its high idealistic ambitions. In the quarrel between the poets and the philosophers, the post-Nietzscheans have decided in favor of the poets, and one might expect the richness of Hegel's aesthetics to be accorded some honorable place in that context. Perhaps the neglect reflects the fact that in the end Hegel places philosophy in an ultimate position in absolute spirit, and indeed seems to place the absolute spiritual significance of the aesthetic behind us. There is an element of discordance with Hegel's proclamation of the end of art in a time when art seems to have displaced the religious in the lists of spiritual ultimacy, and philosophy itself has contented itself with being more or less an academic specialty, whether of an analytical or hermeneutical sort. Hegel is discordant in that post-Hegelian culture has tended to place in art high hopes for a suitable replacement of lost religious transcendence. It is notable even among philosophers at least in the continental tradition, that art has assumed unprecedented (sometimes metaphysical) significance: Schopenhauer, Nietzsche, Heidegger, Adorno, Merleau-Ponty, Badiou, to name some.

Moland situates herself more in Anglo-American philosophy where, here and there, we find a cautious rehabilitation of Hegel after a century of ostracization by the respectable professors. There is a great amount to be learned from the lucid and compact account that she gives of the different parts of Hegel's aesthetics: the different art forms, and the individual arts; the sense of different ends that she claims can be attributed to the forms and the particular arts. A primary aim of her book is to offer an account of the entire trajectory of Hegel's aesthetics. While scholarship on Hegel's philosophy of art has increased in recent decades, the entire range of his thought has not been considered. This book has the ambition to make up for this lack and does take significant steps to do so. Such an ambition of comprehensiveness mirrors perhaps Hegel's own desideratum with regard to philosophical comprehension.

The book provides an excellent overview of the different parts of Hegel's aesthetics. The introduction addresses the scope and significance of Hegel's aesthetics, connecting idealism and aesthetics, reminding us of the much-contested question of the end of art, situates the work in its historical context, and helpfully tells us of questions surrounding the editing of Hegel's text. Part I deals with art and the idea, and here more general connections are made between Hegel's overall systematic thinking and the questions of aesthetics in particular. Part II deals with the particular forms of art, the symbolic, the classical and the romantic, culminating in art's "dissolution" and self-supersession. Moland speaks of "spiritualized imitation", but I would suggest in relation to art after Hegel -- and this is not Hegel himself -- the idea of a post-romantic symbol: a recurrence to what exceeds determination after the acme of infinite inwardness of romantic subjectivity. After all, mimesis always entails a relation to an otherness never to be completely appropriated or interiorized. Part III addresses the system of the individual arts. This shows a progression from the most external in architecture to the most interiorized in poetry, with sculpture, painting, and music in between. In all of these last six chapters she does not lose sight of the larger picture of Hegel's philosophy, is attentive to the significant details of Hegel's accounts, and offers pertinent reflections not devoid of finesse.

This unfolding is underpinned and permeated by certain basic philosophical positions, attributed on the whole to Hegel, and to a degree set forth in a manner that might have been the occasion for further elaboration. Moland defends an aesthetics of truth, but truth here is the truth of idealism, and now and then Hegel's own formulation from the Phenomenology is invoked: the true is the whole. The idealistic truth of the whole is sensuous concretized in art -- variously concretized since there is a plurality to be acknowledged: the plurality of different art forms, the plurality of the individual arts. Idealism seems to mean there is no "given" truth, but it has to be constituted in a process of determination, indeed mutual determination, perhaps in the long run a process of self-determination. This is very true to Hegelian idealism.

Moland speaks of resistance against the given; mutual determination between ourselves and what is other; truth coming to be in the holistic space that comes to be determined in the mutual determination (though again mutual determination is more precisely in Hegel's terms and more ultimately, the self-determination of Geist, hence a self-determination inclusive of same and other, identity and difference). One might query this language of "resisting the given": I think of the difference of Michelangelo and Nietzsche's Zarathustra. Michelangelo speaks of releasing the forms that call to him from the rock; Nietzsche's Zarathustra speaks of going with a hammer to the stone of humankind, and assaulting it to remake it in the image of the dream of the superman. In broad terms, I would say that entirely different aesthetics following from these two manners of relating to the given. While not aesthetically violent in the second sense, there is still less than one would like, in the Hegelian shaping and re-shaping of the given, of the call of otherness as other.

There are different idealisms, of course, and while there might be more stress on this, it is important to acknowledge differences of subjective, objective, and absolute idealism (all have to do with different ways to parse the relation to the "given"). Hegel's is the third, but this implies that there is an idea that cannot be adequately described in the language of just object or subject. For Hegel there is the constituting, indeed constitutive role of the idea in this absolute sense of idealism.

Am I wrong to detect in this book a diffidence about the implied exorbitance of Hegel's position? Where there is something "metaphysical," this is not to the comfort levels of our Zeitgeist. Mostly these comfort levels dictate a more "Kantianized," supposedly "non-metaphysical" account of the constituting process. This may be said to be a social process of constitution in the mutual determination, but in Hegel's system social determination takes form as objective spirit in society. Yet there is absolute spirit that has a more ultimate claim and here art is accorded the privilege with religion and philosophy to be a participant in absolute spirit, to constitute it. The relation of absolute and objective spirit, to speak Hegelese, is easily tilted to social objectification, if we underplay the suggestion that the absolute is not exhausted by its subjective or socially objective concretization.

This is not to espouse a Platonism, as Moland grants (though it is not to exclude consideration of the Platonic idea entirely). In fact, the notion of idea is central to Hegel's view of art and the beautiful since this latter is defined as the ideal, which again is the sensuous concretion of the idea, itself more truly described in the language of spirit. Hegel refers to the Platonic idea, as he does to the Kantian idea, not simply to reject them but to claim that each is differently indeterminate, and in such a manner that we cannot articulate the concrete as such which is the concretion of the idea, the self-concretion of the idea. The ideal of beauty constitutes an absolute aesthetic concretion of the idea. It is no accident that the Greeks were privileged as a people bringing this about. The classical form of art in the sculptures of the gods is the epitome of the beauty of art as such. Such art is not aesthetic in a post-Kantian sense. In the words of the Phenomenology it is Kunstreligion: not the religion of art, but religion in the form of art.

There is a phrase that recurs: Moland speaks of art as making the familiar strange, making the strange familiar. The whole tenor of Hegelian idealism, I would say, is much more a matter of making the strange familiar than the familiar strange. Strangeness has too much of the equivocations of estrangement and to be dialectically overcome by Hegel. There is also Hegel's important claim of the unity of human and divine but one might suggest that there is something equivocal about that unity rather than some lucid dialectical reconciliation. One can be entranced with the details of Hegel's aesthetics, and yet there is something of world-historical seriousness intended by it. This is especially evident with what one might call the epochal character of the history of art, manifested in the three art-forms, the symbolic, the classical and the romantic. The end of art comes back again here: Romantic art brings out of hiddenness any mystery present in and from the symbolic beginning, which as hidden occupies spirit, which once manifest no longer occupies spirit. This result, while necessary for Hegel, is fraught with ambiguity. It produces a subjectification that Hegel claims to make intelligible and yet does not entirely endorse (I am thinking of his criticism of contemporary romanticism).

Thus, Hegel speaks of an overcoming of the content of art in its otherness. The modern romantic artist is no longer tied to the substantial ground of a rich Sittlichkeit. The artist is a subjective creator, no longer rooted in one of the essential Weltanschauungen. In a revealing passage Hegel states that what was implicit in the beginning has been brought out of its hiddenness. In the language of this book, the making familiar of the strange trumps the making strange of the familiar. In the course of the art's development, Hegel says:

the whole situation has altogether altered. This, however, we must not regard as a mere accidental misfortune suffered by art from without owing to a distress of the times, the sense for the prosaic, lack of interest, etc.; on the contrary, it is the effect and the progress of art itself which, by bringing before our vision as an object its own indwelling material, at every step along this road makes its own contribution to freeing art from the content represented. What through art or thinking we have before our physical or spiritual eye as an object has lost all absolute interest for us if it has been put before us so completely that the content is exhausted, that everything is revealed, and nothing obscure or inward is left over any more . . . The spirit only occupies itself with objects so long as there is something secret, not revealed (ein Geheimes, Nichtoffenbares), in them. This is the case so long as the material is identical with the substance of our own being. But if the essential world views implicit in the concept of art, and the range of the content belonging to them, are in every respect revealed by art, then art has got rid of this content which on every occasion was determinate for a particular people, a particular age, and the true need to resume it again is awakened only with the need to turn against the content that was alone valid hitherto.[1]

The romantic subjectification of artistic origination gives the individual creator a new, more democratic freedom, licensing him to take up any content as the occasion of the display of his own virtuosity. But this greater subjective freedom means for Hegel the loss of substantial grounding, and so a loss of spiritual seriousness for art. The paradox: the deeper subjective inwardness becomes, the more its nature as spirit is developed, the greater the danger of the loss of spiritual seriousness on the part of that subjectivity. If everything and anything can now be the content of art, nothing really shows itself as aesthetically absolute anymore, except perhaps the subjective virtuosity of the individual creator. His subjective originality replaces (let us call it) the trans-subjective origin whose aesthetic self-mediation is historically effected by the three formations of art. Hegel provides us with a hermeneutic narrative that claims to show the necessity of that loss, though his own vituperation against the shallowness of romantic subjectivity in his own time shows him in no way to be reconciled with its spiritual bankruptcy. The romantic form of the aesthetic creates a dilemma it itself cannot solve. Romantic inwardness itself points to its own self-transcending as art. Ultimately only philosophy, as Hegel understands philosophy, can bring to be the absolute self-mediation of thought thinking itself through its own otherness, both in form and content. Religion and art may have the absolute content but they both lack the absolute form, since their forms are still burdened with an otherness not yet dialectically overcome.

I am pointing to a deep tension in Hegel for whom art is absolute precisely because it can sensuously concretize the divine, or the union of the human and divine, and when that vocation is exhausted, it becomes a thing of the past on the part of its highest destiny. Hegel gives us an account claiming to make this intelligible, though the result is an aesthetization of art in which the sense of ultimate seriousness does not count in the same way as it did before. Much commentary on Hegel's philosophy of art is offered from the perspective of that aesthetization, inseparable also in the long run from a secularization of art. The tensions between art as religious and as aesthetic are deeply inherent in Hegel's view to the point where what he thinks is a kind of dialectical reconciliation serves often to cover over an equivocation, and not least with respect to any claims made to art's absoluteness. All of these equivocations are hidden in the proclamation of the unity of the human and the divine. These equivocations are not explored by Moland. I am loathe to say they are not granted perhaps because they are not understood as such. I hope I have given above an appreciative picture of the many excellences of this book. But without the exploration of these equivocations I think the Hegelian claim about the end of art cannot be adequately illuminated.

The unity of the human and divine lends itself to a multiplicity of interpretations from the mystical to the atheistic, but these interpretations have cultural and historical effects, as we can see from the history of the interpretation of Hegel. Here we find violent atheistic interpretations as well as blander humanistic reconciliations which do not cut the Gordian knot like the former, but bleach Hegel's thought of more perplexing metaphysical and theological claims. One recalls Zarathustra saying: The poets lie too much. One could worry that in much of aesthetic culture after Kant, and perhaps even more in post-modern culture, the saying could be transported -- the poets lie too much and moreover the poets have prevailed against Hegel -- for now. But deep in their lies lie truths that even they do not, and perhaps much of philosophy does not, realize, much less explore. We can offer Hegel rehabilitation on the basis of the vanishing of the divine in the equivocal unity of the human and the divine. The strange is made too familiar. On these terms, the end result can too often be a kind of beige Hegelianism. It would be unfair to call this book beige Hegelianism. Not at all. There is an abundance of finesse for the subtle colors of Hegel's aesthetics, and not without an ear for forms of otherness calling from the rock of Hegelian system.

[1] G. W. F. Hegel Vorlesungen über die Ästhetik, vols. 13-15 of Werke, ed. E. Molderhauer and K.M. Michel (Frankfurt: Suhrkamp, 1969-71), vol. 14, 234 where Hegel speaks of die Auflösung (dissolution) and das Ende of the romantic artform; Hegel's Aesthetics; trans. T. M. Knox (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1975), II, 604-05. On Hegel's own harshness towards the subjectification of Originalität, see Vorlesungen über die Ästhetik, 13, 380-84; Hegel’s Aesthetic, I, 294-98.