Heidegger and a Metaphysics of Feeling

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Sharin N. Elkholy, Heidegger and a Metaphysics of Feeling, Continuum, 2008, 159pp., $130.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780826498755.

Reviewed by Dana S. Belu, California State University at Dominguez Hills


Sharin Elkholy's Heidegger and a Metaphysics of Feeling offers an original interpretation of the role of Angst in Heidegger's Being and Time. Against the grain of many and varied commentators on this theme, Elkholy's central thesis is that the experience of Angst or anxiety, and the concomitant encounter with the nothing fundamentally disindividuates and strips inauthentic Da-sein of any and all sense of selfhood. The last two chapters develop this thesis at some length and conclude with an argument for the retrieval of Da-sein's authenticity as a pre-personal and historically-inflected identity that Elkholy explains using her own concept of "ontological occlusion".

The book is divided into four chapters. While the last two chapters presuppose that the reader already has more than a rudimentary familiarity with Being and Time and at least some of its influential interpretations, the first two chapters are excellently suited for the newcomer. They present a clear and detailed account of main ontological (existential) categories along with a special emphasis on "inauthenticity" and being-toward-death. The detailed account of "inauthenticity" as a deep form of conformism where Da-sein relates to its possibilities in a "leveled down" way shaped by a prereflective understanding of Being as "objective presence" is important to the structure of the book. This is because Elkholy's work turns on clearly understanding the difference between Da-sein's authentic and inauthentic or empirical comportment in its being-toward-death and guilt.

By the end of chapter two, "Being-toward-death/Stage one of Angst: The Groundlessness of Being and the Unboundedness of Da-sein", Elkholy concludes that being-toward-death dissolves the boundaries of Da-sein into the nothing. She claims that "while Angst may indeed disclose the totality of the whole of the being of Da-sein and the whole of the being of the world, it does not disclose this totality as finite. Rather, Angst discloses the nothing -- the unbounded groundless nothing of Being -- and not finitude" (62). Faced with the loss of all relationships to self and others along with the nullity of all factical and ontological possibilities, Da-sein's personal identity breaks down completely so that it finds itself paralyzed. In this context of utter meaninglessness, Elkholy argues, it is incoherent to claim, as many commentators do, that Angst leads to the discovery of a true or authentic self. For instance, the reason why Miguel de Beistegui has a difficult time identifying the self that is leftover once Da-sein is freed from the norms of deep social conformism in its experience of Angst is precisely because no such self is there (59). What appears to be there is a perduring depersonalized and denuded Da-sein. Ultimately, what is at stake in this interpretation of Angst is Elkholy's contention that the ontological dimension of being-toward-death is the encounter with the nothing that "returns Da-sein to the mystery, to the nonobjective groundless ground of its being", rather than trapping it in an empirical, and therefore inauthentic, understanding of death as biological demise (101).

Chapter three is entitled "Being-guilty-Stage two of Angst: The Temporalization of Angst and how the Nothing becomes Something". Here Elkholy argues that the conditions of the possibility of Da-sein's finitude and authenticity depend on Da-sein's ability to face up to its ontological guilt through the retrieval of historical possibilities against the established background of the nothing as a "groundless ground" (72). Elkholy performs a clear exegesis of the distinction between Heidegger's ontological sense of guilt as a structural and unpayable debt (Schuld), for instance to tradition, and the derivative sense of guilt that engages psychological and ethical registers where Da-sein seeks to pay off, or to pay back, what it owes in the attempt to close the circle of responsibility and gain a clear conscience. Elkholy writes,

Being-guilty is the possibility for conscience, but it is nevertheless the "call of conscience" that discloses Da-sein in its being-guilty … Significantly, the "voice of conscience" (Stimme des Gewissens) says nothing because it is disclosed in Angst. (75)

As Elkholy perceptively remarks, the question becomes: "How then does the nothing of Angst bring about any certain and finite understanding, and how is this understanding to serve as the ground of Da-sein's authentic existence with others in its being-in-the-world?" (80).

Here the argument moves at a level of abstraction that is often difficult to follow. What Elkholy appears to argue is that somehow Da-sein must tarry resolutely with the nothing rather than succumb to paralysis or flee into the busyness of everyday life that covers up anxiety. This comportment is characterized by what Elkholy calls Da-sein's "stillness" where Da-sein "takes itself back in death" and

holds open the nothing by demanding Angst of itself in a movement forward and a movement back that converges in the present. Holding open the nothing creates a space that will allow possibilities to arise as they are in the open or clearing that is the totality of Da-sein and world disclosed and endured in the stillness of the nothing and the holding back of the self in Angst. (89)

Here, then, we have Da-sein as a selfless self, a denuded self that does take up any particular possibilities but rather relates to the groundless ground of its possibilities, presumably the ground of its tradition and history that it recognizes only dimly or prereflectively. This recognition depends on a kind of mirroring or what Elkholy calls an "existential identity" that is somewhat mysteriously set up between this pre-personal Da-sein and the world established by Angst.

Elkholy concludes the chapter by making a distinction between Heidegger’s ontological story and the existentialist or subjective interpretation of Angst and authenticity whereby Da-sein realizes the contingency of its identity, presumably understanding that there is no part of its existence that is not up for reinterpretation, and therefore posits itself as the responsible ground of its possibilities. For the former, Angst allows Da-sein to become attuned

to what shows itself, instead of to the projections of its world that are given to it by the interpretations of the They … What shows itself in an authentic understanding of Being are possibilities that belong to the world characterized by generations past and future generations to come. (93)

But this distinction appears to mark no substantive difference since even the conditions of existential choice are constituted by the shared world. Conversely, in order for the world to be a world on the terms that Heidegger sets in Being and Time it has to be retrieved by an individual Da-sein. In other words, any and all possibilities that show up or are relevant to Da-sein must be shared in order to be intelligible and in order to be intelligible they must in some way be a part of the normative discourse of the They (das Man) and they must be chosen. The problem here is a lack of emphasis in Elkholy's study on the distinction between inauthenticity and everydayness. She needs to emphasize that unlike inauthentic Da-sein, which covers up anxiety, authentic Da-sein does not seek to be assuaged by what one (das Man) does, but neither can it completely escape the normative horizon determined by the They (das Man). Perhaps what Elkholy means here is that authentic Da-sein allows possibilities that are more marginal rather than mainstream to manifest themselves, but if this is her intention she does not say. Instead she proposes that Da-sein's finitude and authenticity ultimately depend on a "yoking" of Angst to aletheia.

In chapter four, "Angst and Aletheia: Finitude and the Nondialectical Relation of Da-sein and Being", Elkholy underscores her non-subjectivist reading of Da-sein. In fact, she argues that her reading of Angst allows us to see that the later Heidegger's so called turn (Kehre) toward the history of Being (Seinsgeschichte) and away from the language of the ontological difference is already available in Da-sein's holding back of its subjective self and tarrying with the nothing, that is, in Da-sein's mode of "letting be". Thus, "Angst opens the way for the comportment of letting-be, belonging to aletheia that positions Da-sein as the recipient of Being in Heidegger's later writings" (112). Somehow a "yoking" is supposed to take place here. Unfortunately, how this link happens remains unexplained until the conclusion of the book (121). Rather than presenting a clear argument, Elkholy appears merely to legislate that Da-sein's radical openness in Angst is like the openness characteristic of aletheia or truth. Thus Da-sein's finitude is established in this likeness, that is a fit or attunement, a "yoking" of Angst to aletheia (115). Moreover, authentic Da-sein can only know this "yoking" as attunement dimly because it does not yet show up as an individuated Da-sein. Thus, according to Elkholy, "Da-sein's attunement to the world can be gauged by the ease with which it assumes its familiarity with others amidst shared possibilities" (118, my emphasis).

The conclusion to Heidegger and a Metaphysics of Feeling is excellent and any reader of this book would be well served to read it first or in tandem with the introductory chapters. It is concise, clearly recapitulates some of the more abstract connections between death, guilt and authenticity in chapters three and four and provides some concrete content to these structures, especially in its discussion of historicity. For instance,

To take up one's historicity authentically means to be in a dialogue with those who have been there before by way of responding to the world from which these others understood their possibilities, a world whose influence is there in the remnants and ways of being that have been left behind. Authentic historicity moves Da-sein from the They to the We. (123)

Elkholy's conclusion further underscores this movement through her unique concept of "ontological occlusion", which she defines as a relationship between Da-sein and Being that is both a fit and a disruption, or

the affective foundation for the prereflective understanding that 'we' have of our cultural horizons, and the hidden and background understanding of 'our' everyday practices and being-with others. But the occlusion has two sides and equally works to describe the prereflective basis for being closed off to those who are differently attuned. (134)

This double movement of revealing and concealing that characterizes the "ontological occlusion" appears to be the same double movement characteristic of Heidegger's aletheia. It remains unclear what work the ontological occlusion accomplishes that aletheia does not.

What is clear, however, is that Elkholy uses "ontological occlusion" to support her claim that Da-sein's authenticity is possible only at a collective level as a Mitda-sein in the attempt of preserving its unique tradition (132). Thus, "an ontological occlusion is what holds together a historical people"; this is significant for Elkholy's reading of authenticity because she underscores that authentically experienced Angst roots Da-sein in its home ground (130). She writes,

The burden for Heidegger is rooted in the responsibility that Da-sein has to respond to its ancestors and to the historical world into which it has been thrown. To feel this burden to others is to be authentic. It is to discover possibilities in terms of heritage as a response to those who have been there and to feel the weight of this responsibility to others as the meaning of one's finitude. (128)

Yet in the spirit of her notion of "ontological occlusion", it must be the case that some responsibilities will be shirked, for instance to those with whom we do not share a world or an attunement. How do we hear those whose silence does not speak to us?

If, as Elkholy argues, authenticity is the prerogative of Da-sein's attunement to "the ground of its possibilities" and if this ground turns out to be discrete heritages, histories and traditions, then Da-sein, whether individuated or not (she never retrieves an individuated Da-sein), can hear only the call of its own kind, unable to bridge deep cultural differences. Moreover, the political and ethical vector that concludes Heidegger and a Metaphysics of Feeling raises the provocative question of how collective responsibility toward an inherited past can be ethically and politically justified. Since the book does not set out to answer this question it is certainly not the book's fault for not addressing this problem. In fact, the book succeeds in accomplishing the difficult feat of tracing this problem back to its ontological roots.