Heidegger and Logic: The Place of Lógos in Being and Time

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Greg Shirley, Heidegger and Logic: The Place of Lógos in Being and Time, Continuum, 2010, 174pp., $110.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780826424082.

Reviewed by Jonah Wilberg, University of Essex


In his inaugural address at Freiburg University in 1929, Heidegger explicitly challenged the central place given to logical principles in neo-Kantianism, on the basis of a radical account of 'the nothing'. Two years later, Carnap used the tools of symbolic logic to show how Heidegger's assertions about the nothing were illogical and thus meaningless, like much of traditional metaphysics. With Anglo-American philosophers today increasingly interested in the methodology and history of the analytic tradition, it is appropriate that increasing attention is being paid to this emblematic confrontation between Carnap and Heidegger and the philosophical issues emerging from it. Among Heidegger scholars in particular, a fascinating debate has arisen about whether Heidegger's opposition to the methods of modern symbolic logic went as far as Carnap and those following him have claimed.

Greg Shirley's Heidegger and Logic aims to take this debate to the next level, in large part by providing the first sustained treatment of the relevant aspects of Heidegger's early philosophy. Shirley traces Heidegger's treatment of logical issues back to his very earliest work and its neo-Kantian context. He provides a sophisticated interpretation of Heidegger's account of the copula, truth, negation and the nothing in the period surrounding Being and Time. He also gives a detailed interpretation of Heidegger's lecture course on 'The Metaphysical Foundations of Logic', showing that for Heidegger the normativity of formal inference is grounded in the for-the-sake-of structure of the world.

In the final chapter, Shirley directly takes on the issue of the contemporary relevance of Heidegger's views. He argues that the early Heidegger's account of judgement and the foundations of inference is not rendered obsolete by post-Fregean developments in symbolic logic. Furthermore, he argues that this account enables Heidegger to fend off the charge that he is an irrationalist opponent of modern logic.

Shirley brings a high degree of clarity to the complex task of relating Heidegger's very earliest writings to their neo-Kantian context. Shirley briefly and lucidly discusses Heidegger's 1912 article 'New Research in Logic', his 1913 doctoral dissertation 'The Theory of Judgement in Psychologism: A Critical-Positive Contribution to Logic', and his 1915 Habilitationsschift, 'The Theory of Categories and Meaning in Duns Scotus'. In interpreting Heidegger's philosophical development he usefully stresses the influence of Emil Lask (to whom Heidegger dedicated his Habilitationsschrift). As Shirley presents it, Lask develops the neo-Kantian project of a transcendental logic in two main ways. Firstly, he shifts the focus from transcendental conditions of knowledge to transcendental conditions of meaning and truth. Secondly, he denies that subjectivity has any role to play in a correct account of these conditions. Shirley argues that Heidegger's Lask-inspired early work encounters tensions in the latter's philosophy which eventually lead him to recover a transcendental role for subjectivity in the form of the existential analytic of Dasein in Being and Time.

Shirley's second chapter is an exposition of Heidegger's 'hermeneutics of judgement', focusing principally on Being and Time and the 1927 lecture course Basic Problems of Phenomenology. Shirley structures his exposition around three main themes, which he shows to be interrelated: the copula, truth and negation. Many of Shirley's conclusions are standard fare for Heidegger scholars. Regarding the copula, for instance, Shirley concludes that, for Heidegger, "the intelligible unity of the judgement/assertion as a conceptual/verbal complex made possible by the copula … articulates the intelligible unity or as-structure of the object of the judgement/assertion" (89). Nevertheless, Shirley makes a genuine contribution to existing scholarship when he brings out the crucial role of negation and negative judgement in Heidegger's account. In particular, Shirley shows how Heidegger's notoriously obscure account of the nothing can be seen as part of an account of the truth (i.e., for Heidegger, uncoveredness) of Being as bimodal, such that it grounds the possibility of bivalence at the level of judgement and assertion. In addition, Shirley argues that this account enables a defense of Heidegger's theory of truth against well-known criticisms by Ernst Tugendhat.

The third chapter -- arguably the core chapter -- of Shirley's book offers a sustained discussion of Heidegger's neglected 1928 lecture course, Metaphysical Foundations of Logic. After patiently following Heidegger's lengthy treatment of the way logic and metaphysics are related in Leibniz's philosophy, Shirley attempts to articulate Heidegger's own philosophical aims in the lecture course. In broad outline, Shirley's interpretation is clear enough: Heidegger aims to show how logic is grounded in a metaphysics of truth, and more specifically that the normative, logical constraints on discursive thought are derivative of the practical, teleological 'for-the-sake-of' character of the world, which Heidegger calls 'ground as such'. In a particularly admirable move, Shirley sketches a way to fill a lacuna in Heidegger's account by offering a more detailed account of the way the 'if-then' structure of inference might be derived from the practical, 'if possibility X then possibility Y' structure of the world.

When it comes to locating these ideas in the context of Heidegger's larger philosophical project, Shirley's interpretation is less clear. Shirley's preferred way of expressing Heidegger's position is to say that "logic is grounded in lógos as temporality" (107). However, the term 'lógos' employed here (as well as in the title of the chapter and the subtitle of the book) is never clarified in any detail. Initial suggestions that the term is roughly synonymous with 'meaning' are destabilized by a frequent and irregular use of the locution: 'lógos as [X]' . Aside from 'lógos as temporality', Shirley speaks of 'Lógos as the normative structure of categorical logic', 'Lógos as inference', 'lógos as practical consequence' and 'lógos as judgement and inference' -- at times all on the same page (107).

There is further scope for confusion regarding Shirley's use of the English word 'logic'. In his introduction, Shirley claims that "Heidegger uses three terms that translate as logic: lógos, Logik and Logistik" (9). Since, as Shirley goes on to explain, these Ancient Greek and German words between them cover a wide range of significations, the choice to translate them all as 'logic' would be rather confusing. Fortunately, Shirley does not follow through on his explicit translation policy: in practice, he mostly uses the term 'logic' as a translation of Logik, in approximately the neo-Kantian sense of a theory of concepts, judgement and inference. Of course, most contemporary Anglophone philosophers use the word 'logic' in a quite different sense, to refer to the mathematic logic developed by Frege, Russell, Carnap and others. Caveat emptor, therefore: the bulk of Heidegger and Logic concerns Heidegger's thoughts on concepts, judgement and inference, rather than Heidegger's philosophy of logic, in the contemporary sense.

It is true that Shirley's fourth and final chapter does attempt to bridge the gap between Heidegger and contemporary mathematical logic. Shirley aims to show that the Heideggerian view of 'logic' not only fails to be rendered obsolete by subsequent developments in logic, it can be "extended to serve as the basis for a novel account of contemporary mathematical logic" (120). Consequently, he argues, Heidegger can be defended from the charge, made by Carnap and others, that he is an irrationalist opponent of mathematical logic. These are ambitious aims for a single chapter, and in my view Shirley's arguments fall short of the required standard.

Shirley defends Heidegger's account against the charge of obsoleteness by showing how it can be extended to cover specific aspects of modern mathematical logic. At the heart of Shirley's argument is the claim that Heidegger's account of truth is compatible with some standard accounts of truth in contemporary philosophy of logic. A brief discussion of Crispin Wright's work on truth is followed by a longer account of the way Heidegger would have understood Tarski's conception of truth as articulating a correspondence theory of truth that is derivative of the notion of truth as uncovering. Shirley moves quickly over this difficult terrain, and there are many questions that might be raised about the details of his argument. But the central problem with his argument is that even if Heidegger's account is compatible with the specific aspects of modern mathematical logic Shirley considers -- primarily, Tarski's formal conception of truth -- it may still be incompatible with, and so perhaps rendered obsolete by, other aspects of modern mathematical logic.

This worry is particularly urgent given that the debate between Heidegger and Carnap -- Shirley's next topic -- precisely turns on whether Heidegger's account is compatible with a different aspect of mathematical logic: the use of existential quantification in first-order predicate calculus. As Shirley presents it, Carnap's charge is that in making assertions like 'the nothing itself nihilates', Heidegger illegitimately uses the word 'nothing' to refer to an entity, as opposed to using it in its ordinary sense, the sense expressed in predicate logic by negative existential quantification (for example, the English sentence 'Nothing is outside' is formalized as: ~x (Ox) where '~' is the operator for negation, '' is the operator for existential quantification, and 'Ox' means: x is outside).

Shirley rebuts Carnap's arguments in a few lines. He correctly points out that Heidegger's account of the nothing as an aspect of the being of beings means that he intends to use the word 'nothing' neither to refer to an existing entity nor in the sense of negative existential quantification. He briskly -- and again correctly - concludes that Carnap is wrong to accuse Heidegger of using the word to refer to an entity. But by taking this to be the end of the story, Shirley fails to treat Carnap with the same hermeneutic charity he shows to Heidegger. For it requires only a little rational reconstruction of Carnap's position to see that on his view the two uses of the word 'nothing' he discusses -- negative existential quantification on the one hand and reference to an entity on the other -- jointly exhaust the legitimate usage of the word, essentially because these are the only uses that are formalizable using predicate logic. So the fact that Heidegger is trying to use the word in some mysterious third way, far from constituting a rebuttal of Carnap's case, is rather precisely what indicts him on Carnap's view.

Albert Borgmann and Edward Witherspoon are among the Heidegger scholars who have been sympathetic to Carnap's view that Heidegger's philosophy manifests an opposition to mathematical logic. Shirley's treatment of their arguments is no better than his treatment of Carnap's. Borgmann claims that, for Heidegger, symbolic logic "can have no regulative force in the examination of the ontological conditions that make logic possible" (145). Shirley's response is that "Heidegger does not claim that logical constraints are unnecessary for philosophical discourse, but simply that they are insufficient" (145). Maybe so, but this clearly does not entitle Shirley to conclude that for Heidegger fundamental ontology is "subject to the normative constraints of logic" (145) -- the argument here has the form: Heidegger does not claim not-A, therefore Heidegger believes A.

Witherspoon claims that it is Heidegger's intentionally non-referential use of terms like 'nothing' and 'being' in fundamental ontology that makes him an opponent of logic, since the laws of logic apply only to referential discourse. Shirley's response is evasive. He correctly points out that Witherspoon cannot simply assume such non-referential use of language is illegitimate and meaningless when Heidegger can be read as arguing precisely for its legitimacy and meaningfulness. But the real issue is whether this (for Heidegger, legitimate and meaningful) use of language is in any sense subject to logical norms.

Shirley's overconfidence in defending Heidegger perhaps ultimately derives from the thought that Heidegger's "intention to secure an adequate foundation for logic … is sustained sufficiently to allow Heidegger to avoid the charge of irrationalism" (148). This intention may be sufficient to absolve Heidegger of 'irrationalism' in the loose sense of a completely unqualified opposition to logic and rationality. But in that sense, probably no philosopher has ever really been an irrationalist. The kind of 'irrationalism' at issue in the debate between Heidegger and Carnap, and of interest to those concerned with the methodological divisions of twentieth century philosophy, is a specific opposition to the methodological use of modern mathematical logic in fundamental areas of philosophy.

Shirley fails to show that Heidegger was not an irrationalist in this sense. For one thing, it remains far from clear that Heidegger had the intention, or the resources, to secure a foundation for specifically modern, mathematical logic. But even if this intention could be fulfilled by grounding mathematical logic in fundamental ontology, the force of the objections of Carnap, Borgmann and Witherspoon is that this would leave open the question whether the discourse of fundamental ontology itself, with its non-referential use of terms like 'being' and 'nothing', is itself subject to norms of the mathematical logic that it allegedly grounds. Until it is shown that Heidegger's assertions about being and the nothing can be clarified using first-order predicate logic (or perhaps one of the many 'non-classical' systems of mathematical logic that have been developed since Carnap's day), there will be no real rapprochement between Heideggerian ontology and traditional analytic philosophy.

The early chapters of Heidegger and Logic provide a number of genuine insights into aspects of Heidegger's early philosophy. However, Shirley overestimates the extent to which these insights shed light on the important historical and methodological questions concerning Heidegger and mathematical logic.