Heidegger and the Issue of Space. Thinking on Exilic Grounds

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Alejandro A. Vallega, Heidegger and the Issue of Space. Thinking on Exilic Grounds, Pennsylvania State University Press, 2003, 202pp, $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 0271023074

Reviewed by Jeff Malpas, University of Tasmania


Alejandro Vallega’s Heidegger and the Issue of Space begins with a crucial distinction between the concepts of exile and the ‘exilic’. The life of exile, Vallega tells us, is a life that is outside of and excluded from its unchanging origin, the exilic life, on the other hand, experiences such life as ‘beyond unchanging origins in all its senses of being’. There is an ambiguity in Vallega’s account of the exilic since it seems itself to be defined, at least initially, in a way that makes it dependent on exile. Thus, in the exact manner in which Vallega introduces the notion, the exilic seems to be a way of experiencing the life of exile, which is a life that is excluded from origin, and yet refers back to it, as a life that is beyond such origin. The dependence of the exilic on exile is not entirely clear in Vallega’s own discussion, and sometimes he seems more concerned to emphasize exile and the exilic almost as opposed concepts, but the dependence would seem essential to the idea of the exilic as such. The exilic depends on two notions: a sense of origin and with it a desire to regain that origin, and a sense of being beyond all such origin. The exilic is thus a response to exile that makes sense only in relation to exile. A conception of the exilic that consisted simply in a rejection of the idea of origin, would surely have little reason to be called exilic (I would not call it nomadic either), but would simply be a form of what we might term ‘atopia’. Neither exile, nor the exilic can properly be said to be atopic – instead both involve a certain way of understanding, experiencing, and relating to topos. What is at issue in the idea of the exilic, then, is the recognition of what draws us in the call of origin, and yet a refusal of that call.

Inasmuch as both exile and the exilic constitute a recognition of the way being and topos are related, so one way to explore both exile and the exilic would be through an investigation of the relation to topos that they each imply. Vallega does not take this path, however, at least not in any explicit fashion, but instead takes up the notion of the exilic as a way to open up the question of ‘alterity’. The thought of Heidegger is the specific philosophical topos within which this task is pursued. It is from this perspective that ‘the issue of space’ appears. It is not space as such that is the focus here, but rather space and spatiality as these provide a figure for the question, the thought, the experience, of alterity in Heidegger. To what extent space is the marker for alterity in any broader sense (might alterity itself require spatialisation?) remains unclear in Vallega’s discussion, but that is itself a marker for the way space emerges as an issue for Vallega almost exclusively, it seems, in terms of the way it allows alterity to appear. Thus, although Vallega includes detailed discussions of Heidegger’s problematic treatment of spatiality in Being and Time (which constitutes the largest part of the discussion), as well as the emergence of spatial and topographic notions in Heidegger’s later writing, these discussions are directed less at a thinking through of space and place as such, as a means to engage with alterity in Heidegger’s work, and so also to develop the idea exilic thinking as itself undertaken in and through that work.

Given the way in which alterity functions as a central notion in much contemporary thinking, Vallega’s topic is clearly an important one, while the book provides the only real discussion of alterity as it might be taken to arise within Heidegger’s own work. It is also quite clear that the basic idea on which Vallega draws here, the idea that the question of alterity can be seen to arise in connection with a form of thinking that we may call ‘exilic’, and, tied to this, the idea of alterity as itself implicated in spatiality, is a significant and fruitful one. However, it also seems to me that there are some questions that may be asked of Vallega’s work. Some of these concern matters that I have alluded to already: the fact that Vallega chooses not to take up in any detail the way exile and the exilic already point towards a notion of notion of topos; the way in which spatiality emerges largely as it functions as a figure for alterity, rather than in its own terms. But I wonder also at the focus on alterity in apparent separation from the idea of identity with which it must always be conjoined. What would it mean to think identity in ‘exilic’ terms? And connected to this, what would it mean to think ‘origin’ in such a way? Vallega’s references to origin almost always occur with the qualification ‘unchanging’ – it is the idea of ‘unchanging origin’ that exilic thinking is most often said to refuse. But why should origin be unchanging? What of an origin that is understood as characterized by both change and perdurance? Is such an origin possible? And what would be the character of thinking that looked toward such an origin? This brings me to one final point – a point that concerns what seems to me a strange and inexplicable omission from Vallega’s account as a whole: while Vallega gives a central role to the idea of the exilic, nowhere does he comment on Heidegger’s own emphasis on the idea of homecoming. What is Vallega to make, for instance, of the passage in the ‘Letter on Humanism’ (in Pathmarks, p.257), in which Heidegger writes: ‘In the lecture on Hölderlin’s elegy ‘Homecoming’ (1943) [the]… nearness ‘of’ being, which is the Da of Dasein …is called the ‘homeland’‘. The word is thought here in an essential sense, not patriotically or nationalistically, but in terms of the history of being. The essence of homeland, however, is also mentioned with the intention of thinking the homelessness of contemporary human beings from the essence of being’s history. “Homelessness” consists in the abandonment of beings by being. Homelessness is the symptom of the oblivion of being. Is exilic thinking homeless? And if not, what homecoming is possible for it?