Heidegger and the Measure of Truth: Themes from His Early Philosophy

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Denis McManus, Heidegger and the Measure of Truth: Themes from His Early Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2013, $75.00 (hbk), 272pp., ISBN 9780199694877.

Reviewed by William Blattner, Georgetown University


Denis McManus proposes an approach to Heidegger's early thought that centers on Heidegger's understanding of how the phenomenon of truth is tied to practice. McManus argues that Heidegger's philosophy is much closer to that of the later Wittgenstein than is commonly supposed, that he is not offering a philosophical system, but rather proposing a manner of disciplining our philosophical reflection by attending carefully to the diverse ways in which we find ourselves responsive to the world around us. This is a bold, exciting, and challenging approach. It is accessible to those already steeped in 20th century European philosophy and those who are not. As is always the case in interpreting an author as difficult as Heidegger, there is plenty of room to nitpick with the interpretation, but I will avoid doing so. I will, nonetheless, raise a couple of worries about it.

"The measure of truth" names the fundamental idea that McManus draws out. He argues that any attempt to assess the correspondence or "con-formity" of a thought or statement to the world or the facts rests on a prior grasp in each case of the "measure of truth," the yardstick by which such conformity may be assessed. "Constitution" is the term that designates the way in which such measures of truth are embodied in our understanding and thereby structure our experience of object-domains. Phenomenology is the study of constitution. (In a brief appendix McManus concedes that on his approach it is difficult to see how Heidegger understood himself to have a criticism of Husserl's methodology. We are not required to reconstruct a viable criticism of Husserl on behalf of Heidegger, but the ability to do so would certainly count in favor of a reconstruction of the early Heidegger's methodological reflections. Heidegger may, of course, have been confused in his criticisms of Husserl, or even disingenuous.)

For Heidegger measures of truth are embodied in practice, a thesis that McManus calls "the primacy of practice." In order to clarify his approach to this thesis, he contrasts it with one of the best-known interpretations of the early Heidegger: Hubert Dreyfus's Being-in-the-World (MIT Press, 1991). Dreyfus draws a distinction between the "theoretical attitude," in which we encounter decontextualized entities "present-at-hand," and "engaged coping," in which we encounter context-dependent entities "ready-to-hand." McManus examines Dreyfus's arguments in detail and poses a dilemma for him. In treating cognition and rule-following as requiring a foundation in engaged coping, he appears to adopt what John McDowell has called "the view from sideways on," that is, a standpoint from which we view meaning, reference, truth, and rule-following as detached from the world and as requiring an explanation of how they connect to it.[1] That is, Dreyfus seems to view cognition and rule-following as if they were free-floating activities that need an external connection to practice; he then sets a research program of "showing . . . how the ground floor of pure perception and receptive coping supports the conceptual upper stories of the edifice of knowledge."[2] The objection to Dreyfus's approach would then be that the view from sideways on makes no sense. To paraphrase Heidegger, such a program makes no sense "if it is [pursued] by Dasein as Being-in-the-world; and who else would [pursue] it?" (Being and Time, 247)

If Dreyfus's true goal is not to take the view from sideways on, but rather to reject it, then the conclusion is not that there must be a background of engaged coping that explains and grounds cognition so conceived, but rather that cognition is not what it has traditionally been conceived to be and does not in turn require grounding in a background. And if this is right, the concept of the "background" makes no sense either, as it is drawn in contrast with detached cognition. McManus's objections to this aspect of Dreyfus's interpretation of Heidegger[3] are detailed, careful, and forceful, perhaps even fatal.

If Dreyfus's approach to the primacy of practice is wrong, then how should it be understood? McManus turns to one of Heidegger's enduring preoccupations: the notion of truth. He agrees with those commentators (notably, Mark Wrathall) who argue that Heidegger does not substitute a new-fangled notion of truth for the traditional theory of "correspondence," as, e.g., verificationists do.[4] Rather, Heidegger argues that the common-sense notion of truth as corresponding or conforming to the world relies upon practices of measuring such conformity. The question, "Does this statement correspond to the facts?" has meaning only in the context of a practice of assessing that putative correspondence. To be in a position to assess whether "Roy Hibbert is 7′ 2″ tall" is true, one must know how to measure his height. To know how to do this is to know, among other things, that the tape measure must be drawn straight up, rather than across his body, while Hibbert is standing straight, rather than slouching. Think of the difference between measuring a computer screen, which is done diagonally, and measuring a person's height. Thus, a practice of measuring is presupposed by the question, "How tall is Hibbert?" as well as by any answer to such a question. McManus is not expansive about what form of presupposition this is, though he does refer the reader to his previous work on Wittgenstein.

Traditional approaches that ignore the primacy of practice in McManus's sense don't so much offer false theories of truth as treat truth as an abstraction. Think of the famous Aristotelian slogan, embraced by Heidegger, that "Being is said in many ways." Truth is said in many ways as well. This doesn't mean that there is more than one definition of truth, nor different kinds of truth. Rather, the practices for assessing truth vary from proposition to proposition and object-domain to object-domain, as in the example of measuring height. Traditional philosophy seized upon the univocity of the predicate "is true" and treated truth as if it made sense independently of any practical implementation. In Heideggerian language, the tradition treated truth as a free-floating theoretical construct. Thus, when philosophers have tried to offer accounts of truth, say, by positing a relation between a non-real content and a real state of affairs in the world, they haven't actually explained anything. Rather, they have taken a view "from sideways on," in that they first abstract the phenomenon of truth from the practical context in which it arises, and then propose a constructive theory to explain how non-real contents can be re-connected to the world to which they refer.

McManus sees the same dynamic at work in traditional metaphysics, as well as in commentators on Heidegger who approach him as if he were offering an ontology in anything like a traditional sense. Many commentators, myself included, have understood Heidegger to distinguish several regions of being (the present-at-hand, the ready-to-hand, human being) and then (perhaps) to (aim to) address the neo-Aristotelian or Scholastic question, "What is the unity of these manifold ways of being?" perhaps via the notion of Temporality (Temporalität). McManus argues that this is a mistake. The present-at-hand is not a distinctive region of being that may or may not be dependent on the ready-to-hand. Rather, it is the object-correlate of an experience in which we fail to distinguish the many ways in which being can be said. The present-at-hand is an abstraction, rather than a region of being. In Division I, chapter 3, Heidegger shows by way of the example of equipment that we can only understand what an entity is by asking how we grasp it. We understand equipment by putting it to use. It does not follow that "objects of use" are a special ontological domain, somehow more basic than the objects of science. Rather, philosophers should explore how it is in practice that science allows us to encounter its objects, a project Heidegger called an "existential" account of science. What is the measure of truth embodied in scientific practice? The answer to that question might well be that there are many such measures. There is no a priori reason to suppose that the objects of physics, biology, and ecology are disclosed in the same way and that those disciplines have a single, uniform measure of truth. The supposition that they must is a way of being in the grip of the illusion of the present-at-hand.

To motivate this position, McManus first examines and rejects some of the received interpretations of the ontology of the ready-to-hand and present-at-hand. He considers a great many ways of drawing the distinction and argues that none of them works out in detail. In some cases, I would argue, his examination is too quick. In particular, I do not see a clear case against one of the standard approaches (full disclosure: one for which I have argued): that the ready-to-hand is what it is only in virtue of its defining role in human practices, whereas the present-at-hand is what it is independently of any such role it might accidentally play. McManus offers two objections here: First, there is a wide range of cases, and only certain paradigm cases (such as tools and quasars) fall neatly onto one side or the other of this distinction. This is a challenge, but not a refutation, and I have tried to address it by offering an account of what Heidegger means by "involvement" that generalizes from equipmental functionality. McManus asks whether this concept is "well-understood" (72), but does not argue that it is not, unless the second argument is meant to do that. Second, he argues that paradigmatic present-at-hand properties, such as weight and length, are only understood by the way in which they are measured. It might be true that if one had no idea how to measure weight, one would have no useful understanding of the concept thereof. It hardly follows, however, that an object's weight depends on the practice of measuring it, or any human practices at all, for that matter. But surely the appropriateness of a vase as a wedding gift depends entirely on the practices of weddings and gift-giving on which it depends. So, McManus has raised a serious challenge, but he has not succeeded in decisively undermining such an account.

McManus concludes with some meta-philosophical considerations, and it might be best here to let him speak for himself:

The outlook I have sketched here suggests that the real sin that Heidegger wants to expose in our philosophical confusion is our allowing our thought and talk to descend into indeterminacy, a failure to subject our thought and talk to the discipline that our 'pre-ontological understanding' would otherwise impose. . . . The distinguishing feature of the enlightened philosopher, the form that 'ontological understanding' takes, would then not be the possession of the right theory or body of doctrine but a form of attention that she pays to what she says and does. (221)

He suggests that phenomenology is a matter of paying attention in this way, and that it's an approach to philosophizing that Heidegger shares not only with Husserl, but also Wittgenstein. Paying attention to and analyzing the structure of "what we say and do," in particular in so far as we are able to encounter an object of this sort or that (equipment, electrons, other people, communities, etc.) is attending to the constitution of those objects or object-domains.

A final and not insignificant virtue of McManus's reading is that he also manages to tie in Heidegger's early forays into the phenomenology of religion. As he sees it, Heidegger was not attempting to import theological doctrine into philosophy, nor to smuggle in a "crypto-Christianity" in existentialist clothing. Rather, Heidegger noticed early on in the context of religious experience that philosophers tended to ignore the measures of truth that are embodied in religious practice, such as those of "faithful, loving, serving expectation in sadness and joy" (20, quoting the religion lectures). Instead, they treat religion as a set of beliefs about the present-at-hand. McManus views Heidegger as generalizing the early insight he gained about the diversity of measures of truth in the context of the phenomenology of religion.

Let me end by raising a preliminary worry about McManus's notion of the measure of truth. He charges that much traditional philosophy levels off truth and correlatively all modes of being to an abstraction. One might worry that the metaphor of a "measure" of truth, along with McManus's use of examples of literally measuring length, run the same risk. I know what it is to determine whether Hibbert is 7′ 2″ by measuring his height. I don't know what it is to assess the truth of "The president of the US is popularly elected," or "That was not a very nice thing to do," or "That MacBook Pro is expensive" by measuring. I have an idea how to figure out whether they are true, but I have no clear sense of how doing so is in each case a form of "measurement," or what the metaphor of measurement conveys across the range of examples. It must have something to do with having standards of correctness, and the metaphor of a measure is a fine place to start. But we will eventually need more than a metaphor; we'll need an account of how standards operate in our practices that are beholden to truth. As frustrating to some as Heidegger's elusive language of "primordial truth" and "disclosedness" may be, it could well be motivated by a desire to resist obscuring the phenomenon of truth by means of an over-broad metaphor.

In sum, then, Heidegger and the Measure of Truth is a powerful and challenging book, one with which all future discussion of Being and Time will have to reckon. It is, in my assessment, one of the best and most important books written on Heidegger over the past decade, and it establishes McManus as a leading interpreter of Heidegger's early thought.

[1] J. McDowell, "Non-Cognitivism and Rule-Following," 1981.

[2] H. Dreyfus, "Overcoming the Myth of the Mental," APA Pacific Division Presidential Address, 2005.

[3] To be clear: specifically the thesis that a background is needed to ground cognition. McManus's arguments do not target the positive phenomenology of "intuitive expertise" and "engaged coping," for which Dreyfus has become justly famous.

[4] I have argued (in my Reader's Guide to "Being and Time" (Continuum, 2006)) that it is at least misleading to describe the traditional notion in question as a "correspondence theory of truth."