Heidegger and the Problem of Phenomena

Heidegger And The Problem Of Phenomena

Fredrik Westerlund, Heidegger and the Problem of Phenomena, Bloomsbury Academic, 2020, 288pp., $39.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781350262331.

Reviewed by Jussi Backman, University of Jyväskylä


Fredrik Westerlund’s Heidegger and the Problem of Phenomena presents a chronological account of Heidegger’s evolving reflections on the phenomenological method he inherited from Husserl and its inherent concept of phenomena, reflections characterized by a fluctuating but constantly critical altercation with certain basic tendencies of the Husserlian approach. The first part of the study (chapters 1–3) focuses on Heidegger’s earliest 1919–21 Freiburg lectures, which tentatively emphasize the need to increase phenomenology’s sensitivity to pretheoretical or “factical” life as it is concretely lived in existential situations. The second part (chapters 4–8) looks at the emergence of Heidegger’s project of fundamental ontology, culminating in Being and Time (1927), from a deepened awareness of the historical and temporal finitude, situatedness, and context-sensitivity of human access to meaningful phenomena as well as a coupling of phenomenology with Wilhelm Dilthey’s historical hermeneutics and, ultimately, with the Aristotelian question of being qua being. The third part (chapters 9–12) summarizes the fate of phenomenology and phenomena in later Heidegger, where attention is turned from the structure of Dasein’s receptivity to meaning to the “history of being” itself, the historically situated and context-sensitive dynamic of the event (Ereignis) that lets meaningful presence be encountered, and the ways in which the full dimensions of this event have transcended the scope and reach of the Western metaphysical tradition from Plato to Nietzsche. Westerlund concludes the study with an extensive epilogue (chapters 13–15) that constitutes an independent critical reflection on the ramifications of Heidegger’s increasingly radical historicism regarding  ethical normativity and truth.

Westerlund’s book, in my view, claims a place alongside classical phenomenological studies of Heidegger’s thinking such as those of William J. Richardson, Steven Crowell, Daniel Dahlstrom, Burt Hopkins, and Dermot Moran. Its particularly close focus on Heidegger’s early lectures prior to Being and Time also calls to mind Theodore Kisiel’s classic The Genesis of Heidegger’s Being and Time (1993). In a compelling tour de force of scholarship that is at once exegetical and also  philosophical and critical, Heidegger and the Problem of Phenomena, in contrast to the general scholarly tendency to focus on a specific phase of Heidegger’s career (most often the earlier phase), takes on the entire Heideggerian corpus, identifying at its core a tension between the classical Husserlian phenomenological approach that seeks to base its accounts on a universally valid intuitive access to meaning and Heidegger’s gradually deepening “radical historicism,” and his attempt to show that our access to meaningfulness is fundamentally historically situated. In other words, Westerlund focuses on the tension between the phenomenological Heidegger—Husserl’s star disciple and successor in Freiburg—and the hermeneutic-deconstructive Heidegger—the mentor of Hans-Georg Gadamer and the key polemic point of reference for thinkers such as Jacques Derrida, Jean-Luc Nancy, Philippe Lacoue-Labarthe, and Bernard Stiegler.

Westerlund concludes with a critique of the Heideggerian historicization and contextualization of meaningfulness that is both 1) ethical—insisting, with Emmanuel Levinas, that all historical values are ultimately evaluated on the basis of a universal concern for the other as such—and 2) epistemological—arguing, in the spirit of direct realism, that direct phenomenological intuition remains our basic form of concrete access to meaningful phenomena.

  1. Starting from Levinas’s postulate, in Totality and Infinity (1961), that Heidegger prioritizes ontology over ethics and turns a blind eye to the infinite moral claim of the other embodied in the other’s face, Westerlund subscribes to a universal ethics of love claiming that “the personal address of the other and the possibility of loving her is there in every historical situation—that is, regardless of the values and norms that happen to govern my society and my identity” (200). According to Westerlund, Heidegger suppresses “the fact that we are basically open to the call of the other person as someone to love and to care about as such, and that this is a source of moral meaning irreducible to historical values and gods” (202). Heidegger’s historicism thus ultimately results in a kind of intellectual moral bankruptcy culminating in his Nazi interlude and his ultimate failure to atone for this error.
  2. Relying in part on previous critiques by Ernst Tugendhat and Cristina Lafont, Westerlund also rejects Heidegger’s historicization of truth as a situated and contextual event of meaningful unconcealment. Here, too, the gist of Westerlund’s argument is ethical: Westerlund suggests that “when it comes to understanding the structures and ethical-existential significance of our experience of phenomena, we are essentially open to and directed toward realities that transcend our historical concepts and preconceptions and that constitute the source of truth of our understanding” (213). Our factical conceptual preunderstanding, Westerlund maintains, “does not determine what we can experience as meaningful” (215).

In the end, Westerlund maintains, Heidegger’s “ambition to replace intuition-based phenomenology with historical reflection is bound to fail” (217). Heidegger’s “transformation” of phenomenology into a historical mode of thinking (132) amounts, for Westerlund, to a denial of phenomenology as such. The deconstructive logic of the later Heidegger and his followers such as Derrida, Westerlund thinks, is self-defeating: it ultimately presupposes some transhistorical principle of meaning-constitution, such as the Heideggerian event, Ereignis, or the Derridean différance (222). Insofar as we try to understand the human, Westerlund claims, we are always complying with the phenomenological agenda of seeking foundational and universal first-personal experiences (224). Summa summarum: “My suggestion is that in so far as philosophy takes as its task to understand our experience of ethical-existential significance it must primarily take the form of phenomenology” (223).

I must emphasize that I am in complete agreement with Westerlund’s attribution of a “radical historicist” tendency to Heidegger. The depth and detail of Westerlund’s exegetical scholarship is impressive, particularly the attention given to Heidegger’s earliest lecture courses, to which some 50 pages are devoted. Westerlund largely follows certain established approaches and readings of Anglo-American Heidegger research. There are some points in this consensus with which one could take issue, such as the established translation of Eigentlichkeit—a term with which Heidegger designates Dasein’s awareness of the ontologically primordial structure of its own existence as finite, situated, and singularized by the three-dimensional dynamic of its temporality, and which could thus be rendered literally as “propriety” or “appropriateness”—as “authenticity,” a term with a heavy normative load (103–6). Westerlund’s discussion of authenticity is motivated by and closely connected to a general ethical emphasis—like Levinas, Westerlund is concerned about the perceived “egoism” and lack of altruism implicit in Heidegger’s account of Dasein as existing for the sake of its ownmost possibilities (112–18). Another way of approaching this specific question would, of course, be to point out that however intensely and selflessly I may be concerned about my fellow human being, I am still unable to orient my existence to the finite possibilities of someone else, precisely because they are not my possibilities—I may be capable of altruistically dying for someone, but I am unable to die someone else’s death. The singular and situated temporal space allotted to me by my singular birth and singular death cannot be shared as such with others, just as little as birth and death can be shared—that space is my responsibility alone. This basic existential fact by no means excludes the possibility of caring about others, as Westerlund suggests, and thus it does not seem entirely fair to characterize Dasein as a “fundamentally egoistic creature” (117). Rather, one could find in Heidegger a certain ethics of self-responsibility, reminiscent of the ethics of “self-care” discovered by Michel Foucault in Hellenistic philosophy.

Westerlund’s ambitious attempt to tackle Heidegger’s later thought, although limited in scope in comparison to the minute discussion of the first lecture courses, is admirable, and the takes on the nature of Heidegger’s “turn” of the 1930s, on the dynamic of Ereignis, and on the basic function of the fourfold (Geviert) are, in general, highly commendable. What I would take issue with here is Westerlund’s reluctance to characterize the later Heidegger as “phenomenological,” despite Heidegger’s insistence to the contrary. Since Westerlund is adamant on defining phenomenology in terms of the Husserlian focus on immediate intuitive access to meaningful givenness, it is unsurprising that Heidegger’s characterization, in his final 1973 seminar, of his own thinking as a “phenomenology of the inapparent” (Heidegger 1986, 399; 2003, 80)—that is, as a phenomenology of the implicit conditions of phenomenality, of the background context of meaningful presence or accessibility that is not itself immediately phenomenally accessible or present—seemingly fails to convince Westerlund.

The question I would pose to Westerlund, with Heidegger, is to what extent “phenomenological” thinking can exhaustively be defined in terms of the Husserlian understanding of this term. In what sense and according to what criteria has the project of Western philosophy as a whole not been “phenomenological,” that is, an attempt to account for the possibility and the structures of the meaningful givenness of things and of our ability to access them as meaningful through experience and thought? Westerlund gives great importance to “concrete phenomenological descriptions,” that is, to specific analyses of particular types of phenomena in terms of their first-personal meaningful phenomenality. Yet one could argue that, as philosophy, phenomenology—like all philosophy—is fundamentally concerned not with this or that phenomenon or type of phenomenon but with the structures and conditions of phenomenality as such, with the very accessibility and intelligibility of things—that is, ultimately, with the meaningful being of beings—and on this fundamental level we can no longer limit ourselves to specific concrete descriptions. However, we will still be compelled to think and convey our thoughts with the help of concepts, and these concepts will inevitably be, to some extent, borrowed from our background historical tradition.

Westerlund is also dismissive of Heidegger’s attempt, in “The End of Philosophy and the Task of Thinking” (1964) and other late texts, to historically situate and contextualize Husserl’s philosophical project (180–83). Yet it is generally accepted that Husserl’s project was initially a reaction to a specific historical circumstance, namely, the rise of antiphilosophical naturalism, especially in the form of logical psychologism. By its own lights, Husserlian phenomenology was an attempt to recover and salvage a kind of “first philosophy” in order to prevent philosophy from lapsing into the role of a mere handmaiden of natural science, and it is well-known that Husserl saw himself as continuing the work of the modern philosophical classics—the post-Cartesian focus on self-conscious subjectivity as well as the post-Kantian transcendental program. Moreover, in his characterization of his own position as “transcendental idealism” and his rejection of the Kantian things-in-themselves, Husserl, mainly without fully acknowledging it, comes very close to certain positions of the German idealists, Fichte, Hegel, and Schelling, just as the later Heidegger repeatedly suggests. Surely it is no service to Husserl to refuse to admit that, like all philosophers, he thought and wrote in a particular historical juncture or constellation, addressing questions and problems and using historically constituted and charged concepts (such as “consciousness,” “subjectivity,” and “transcendental”)?

What, above all, distinguishes Westerlund’s work from the greater part of Heidegger scholarship is his courageous resolve to assume an independent philosophical position that is directly critical of Heidegger. In order to do justice to this exceptional autonomy, I will conclude with some brief questions and remarks that are first and foremost related to the central principles of Westerlundian philosophy and in themselves largely independent of his reading of Heidegger.

First, Westerlund subscribes to a universal ethics of love, stated in very strong and unequivocal terms: “My claim is that the personal address of the other and the possibility of loving her is there in every historical situation—that is, regardless of the values and norms that happen to govern my society and my identity” (200). Furthermore, “we are always already open to the understanding that all people, universally and without exception, claim our love and care” (201). However, a counterargument that immediately suggests itself here would point to the possibility that the moral exigency of loving all human beings qua persons, without exception, is in fact itself a historically constituted norm emerging in a very specific historical context, first and foremost that of Christian ethics. Moreover, there is the ambiguity of “love” itself. The very concept of love that Westerlund seems to operate with here is clearly not the Greek erōs, erotic desire and pursuit, nor philia, affectionate attachment, but rather agapē, charity, selfless benevolence—a concept that was used in Greek antiquity primarily for the love felt for one’s immediate family members and that only grew into the universal ethical requirement of “loving one’s neighbor” in the context of the Christian ethical teaching that advocates relating to one’s entire community as an enlarged family.[1] If love in the sense of such non-particularistic goodwill is indeed a universal possibility, independent of historical context, why is that notion strikingly absent from the ethics of pre-Christian antiquity? Are the prospects of this concept of love for providing a universal foundation of all ethics not dimmed by the fact that it originates from a very particular historical context? Not necessarily, many would argue—but it would nevertheless be challenging to maintain that this notion of ethics is invariably suggested by a universally and transhistorically accessible ethical intuition.

A closely connected wider question is related to the very meaning of “ethics.” The Levinasian accusation of a traditional prioritization of ontology over ethics (retained by Heidegger) is heavily dependent on a Kantian notion of an ethics of duty, of universally obligating moral maxims, which makes ethics a matter of the will rather than of knowledge, and which ultimately has its roots in a theological ethics of divine command. In the Aristotelian system of knowledge, ethics was ontology, a regional ontological study of active human life in general and, in particular, of the “good life” in the sense of the life that best fulfills humanity and most fully implements the human potential. As many commentators (for example, Volpi 1994) have pointed out, many aspects of Heidegger’s Being and Time are modeled on the Nicomachean Ethics, making fundamental ontology itself an “ethics” in this classical sense.

These somewhat peripheral historical remarks call attention to the inherent problem of Westerlund’s intuition-based epistemic realism: its unwillingness to seriously tackle the possibility that our “immediate” intuitions are themselves historically constituted. The Westerlundian ethics of love and its wider Levinasian ethical framework are highly compelling because they appeal to many contemporary ethical intuitions—and yet, these are intuitions that do not seem to be equally shared by all human beings at all times. Rather, it would appear that these intuitions have been deeply ingrained into the Western intellectual tradition by its specific heritage, including two millenia of Christian thought and two centuries of Kantian and post-Kantian thought. Westerlund voices the conviction that “our concepts [. . .] offer themselves to us as possibilities to grasp or misinterpret matters that we experience irrespective of these concepts” (216). But philosophers since Plato have tended to take seriously the insight that we see matters as specific, determinate, and delimited matters through concepts, and it is with the help of concepts that we identify them as the specific matters that they are. Concepts are typically seen as articulating and dividing reality into identifiable and discrete units or things—without them, reality would be an indeterminate material or sensuous chaos without permanence, a Heraclitean flux.

To be sure, for the greatest part of the history of philosophy, the conceptual structure of reality was seen as fixed and universal, as in Platonic and Hegelian dialectic. It is only in modernity that Western thought has gradually accepted that different linguistic and cultural systems in fact have incommensurable and mutually untranslatable conceptual schemes. For example, to use a favorite example of the advocates of the so-called Sapir-Whorf hypothesis of linguistic relativity, even though the spectrum of visible color detected by the human eye is more or less the same for most human beings, this spectrum can be divided into discrete colors in a practically endless number of ways—and, in fact, the number of color terms used varies heavily according to linguistic and cultural context. It is not incorrect to say that different cultures “see” as many colors as they distinguish through terms.[2] Here it becomes tangible to what extent our most simple and primordial intuitions—immediate color perceptions—are articulated and constituted by concepts that are themselves dependent on cultural context. It is no accident that modern cultural relativism emerged together with modern historical linguistics in the context of German proto-Romanticism—Johann Gottfried Herder’s Treatise on the Origin of Language (1772) is a classic work of both orientations. The discovery of the embeddedness of concepts in historically evolving natural languages coincided with an insight into the historical situatedness of meaningful experience. Heidegger and contemporary poststructuralism are heirs of this Romantic tradition. While there are numerous valid grounds for criticizing this tradition and its general approach, whether phenomenologically or otherwise, its main insights cannot be simply brushed off as irrelevant.

These considerations all underline the extent to which Westerlund’s book exceeds the level of mere commentary; its critical reading of Heidegger is a pathway leading to an independent position in one of the most overarching and enduring discussions of modern thought, the debate between (Enlightenment) universalism and (Counter-Enlightenment) particularism. Herein lies its great philosophical fruitfulness.


Deutscher, Guy. 2010. Through the Language Glass: Why the World Looks Different in Other Languages. New York: Henry Holt & Co.

Heidegger, Martin. 1986. Gesamtausgabe. Vol 15, Seminare. Edited by Curt Ochwadt. Frankfurt am Main: Klostermann.

Heidegger, Martin. 2003. Four Seminars. Translated by Andrew Mitchell and François Raffoul. Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press.

Kuhn, Helmut. 1980. “Liebe I–II,” in Historisches Wörterbuch der Philosophie, vol. 5, edited by Joachim Ritter and Karlfried Gründer, 290–303. Basel: Schwabe & Co.

Volpi, Franco. 1994. “Being and Time: A ‘Translation’ of the Nicomachean Ethics?” translated by John Protevi, in Reading Heidegger from the Start: Essays in His Earliest Thought, edited by Theodore Kisiel and John van Buren, 195–212. Albany, NY: State University of New York Press.



[1] On the several senses of love in classical antiquity and the attempt of Augustine and other Christian thinkers to unify them into one overarching concept, see Kuhn 1980.

[2] This, of course, is a long-debated question. For one of the most recent contributions on the topic, see Deutscher 2010.