Heidegger and the Thinking of Place: Explorations in the Topology of Being

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Jeff Malpas, Heidegger and the Thinking of Place: Explorations in the Topology of Being, MIT Press, 378 pp., $34.15 (hbk), ISBN 9780262016841.

Reviewed by François Raffoul, Louisiana State University


Jeff Malpas' new book follows and expands on his earlier Heidegger's Topology: Being, Place, World (2006), a work that proposed to explore the question of space in Heidegger's thought, or rather, we should say, of place. Indeed, at times (though not consistently, as we will see), Heidegger understands by "space" the scientific, mathematized, homogeneous, and abstract space, which he characterizes as that "homogeneous separation that is not distinct in any of its possible places."[1] In fact, for Heidegger, space presupposes place.  In contrast with Kant, for whom various places and locations are possible on the basis of the one a priori space as an infinite given magnitude, Heidegger stresses that "place is not located in a pre-given space, after the manner of physical-technological space." Rather, the "latter unfolds itself only through the reigning of places of a region" (GA 13, 208/AS, 308). Already in "Building Dwelling Thinking," Heidegger had elaborated on that distinction between space and place, writing that, "The space provided for in this mathematical manner may be called 'space,' the 'one' space as such. But in this sense 'the' space, 'space,' contains no spaces [Räume] and no locations [Plätze]. We never find in it any places [Orte], that is, things of the kind the bridge is."[2]

Accordingly, Malpas explains that Heidegger's Topology attempted to give "an account of the way in which place provides a starting point for Heidegger's thinking as well as an idea toward which it develops" (69).  Further, Malpas insists that "Heidegger's own work cannot adequately be understood except as topological in character, and so as centrally concerned with place -- toposOrtOrtschaft" (43). It was in fact Heidegger himself, in the 1969 Thor seminar, who stressed the topological dimension of his thinking, using the expression "topology of be-ing" [Topologie des Seyns] to replace the earlier expressions "meaning of being" and "truth of being."[3]However, Malpas' broader objective is to reveal the role of place in philosophical thinking as such: "On my account, the attempt to think place, and to think in accord with place, is at the heart of philosophy as such" (43). This is why, Malpas clarifies, "the essays collected here . . . thus focus on the idea of place, first, as it appears in Heidegger's thinking as it arises in a number of ways and in relation to a range of issues, and second, as it can be seen to provide the focus for a distinctive mode of philosophical thinking that encompasses, but is not restricted to, the Heideggerian" (1-2).

The various essays included in this volume do not strictly speaking follow from Malpas' earlier work so much as accompany it. Heidegger and the Thinking of Place is indeed composed of previously published articles or chapters in books, gathered here in one volume. Malpas' book thus constitutes a kind of companion volume of essays to his earlier work. The book is divided into three sections: I. Topological Thinking; II. Topological Concepts; III. Topological Horizons, sections framed by an Introduction and by an Epilogue, "Beginning in Wonder" (previously published in 2006). There are three chapters in section I: the first one, "The Topos of Thinking," examines the notion of topology in Heidegger's work. The second chapter, "The Turning to/of Place," relates Heidegger's later works with the earlier, and appraises the necessity of reengaging Heidegger's later work as a "topological thinking." Chapter 3, "The Place of Topology" (2011), is a response to several scholars' reviews of Malpas' earlier book, Heidegger's Topology.

Section II includes four chapters: Chapter 4, "Ground, Unity, and Limit" (2002), investigates these notions in their topological import and in relation to the question of the transcendental in Heidegger's work. In chapter 5, "Nihilism, Place, and 'Position'" (2010), Malpas considers the notion of place in light of Heidegger's account of nihilism, and how topological thinking can help in overcoming subjectivism, revealing the connection between subjectivity and the problematics of place (108). Chapter 6, "Place, Space, and World" (2010), examines the development of topological thinking in Heidegger's work, focusing on the notion of world and on the relation between space and time. The last chapter of section II, chapter 7, "Geography, Biology, and Politics" (2008), considers the political dimension of a thinking that returns to place, and the political ramification of notions such as rootedness or belonging.

Section III includes 4 chapters: chapter 8, "Philosophy's Nostalgia" (2011), is a beautiful meditation on "the nostalgic," and how it is to be reconsidered positively; it is not simply a temporal return, but a longing for place. For Malpas, "Nostalgia is essentially tied to place" (168). Chapter 9, "Death and the End of Life," considers the mortality of existence as revealing the placed -- bounded -- character of human life, death constituting such an original limitation and placing. In Heidegger's Topology (p. 273), Malpas already observed that "death is the limit that opens up the 'space' within which our lives can be lived." This chapter is a brilliant contribution to a topological understanding of death, echoing some of Heidegger's insights on the positive sense of the limit and of finitude (for instance in the Kantbuch). Chapters 10 (1999), 11 (2007), and 12 (1998) consider relations of the Heideggerian text to Davidson, Benjamin, and the work of art. Instead of summarizing each of the 13 chapters, which would be an impossible task in a short review, I will identify a few key issues that structure Malpas' reflections in this work, and I will attempt to raise some questions.

Malpas often describes the presence of place in experience in terms of the bounded or limited situatedness of existence. This is the import, for example, of chapter 4, which focuses on the theme of the limit, and it is also the focus of chapter 9 on death, what Malpas characterizes as "the limit-character of death" (61). A topological thinking would pay attention to the limited, bounded, that is, placed, character of existence and experience. Indeed, as Malpas reminds us (89-90), it was Heidegger who conceived of place in terms of limit, as in this passage from "Building Dwelling Thinking" where Heidegger explained that, "A space is something that has been spaced or made room for, something that is cleared and free, namely within a boundary, Greek peras. A boundary is not that at which something stops but, as the Greek recognized, the boundary is that from which something begins its presencing." Heidegger then refers to the essential role of the limit, adding that space essentially includes the horismos, the horizon, the boundary, and that "space is in essence that for which room has been made, that which is let into its bounds" (GA 7, 156/PLT, 152, tr. slightly modified, my emphasis, cited, 89-90). Further, throughout the book, Malpas claims that existence is always a being in place, as for instance when he writes that "dwelling is the mode of human being, so human being is essentially a being in place, just as it is also a being in the world" (63). In fact, the claim is even more radical, as Malpas states that to be is to be in place: "To be is to be in place, and to be a phenomenon, in appearing, is similarly to be placed, or, as one might say, totake place" (46).

Those claims are hard to dispute, and Malpas does a brilliant job in demonstrating them. However, it is also the case that Heidegger has always insisted on another characteristic of human existence, namely its ecstatic character, which can be described as a being-outside-itself: existence is always outside-itself, out-of-bounds, transcendent or transcending. This is how, for instance in The Basic Problems of Phenomenology, Dasein is said to be "what oversteps (überschreitend) in its being and thus is exactly not the immanent."[4] More than forty years later, Heidegger would confirm his earlier characterizations of Dasein as ec-static, and state, in the Zähringen seminar (1973), that the essential character of Dasein is the ecstatic: he begins by recalling that "the mode of being of Dasein is characterized in Being and Time by ek-stasis" and then adds: "Dasein is essentially ek-static" (FS, 71). Ontologically understood, the ek-static means being-outside-of. "Now, what does the word 'being' [Sein] mean when one speaks of Da-sein? In contrast with the immanence to consciousness expressed by 'being' [Sein] in consciousness [Bewusst-sein], 'being' [Sein] in Da-sein says being-outside-of . . . " (FS, 71). The passage continues by insisting on this ontological sense of the ek-static: things manifest themselves in a domain which is characterized as an "outside." "The being, in Da-sein," Heidegger explains, "must preserve an 'outside'" (FS, 71). It is this characteristic (being-outside-of) and the necessity of situating Dasein in such an outside that allow one to understand that, "In the expression Da-sein, "being" thus means the ek-stasis of ek-sistence" (FS, 71). A question thus arises: how does one reconcile Malpas' characterization of being-in-place as a being-bounded with Heidegger's determination of existence as ec-static, as a being-beyond-bounds, admitting that this tension may indeed be present within Heidegger's text itself?

When evoking the nostalgic, Malpas develops the notion of a return to place, as return home. The thinking of topos, Malpas explains, takes "the form of a returning to place, a refinding of oneself, a reorientation (even, perhaps, a repositioning) -- as Heidegger himself refers to it, a form of homecoming, although a coming-home to that from which we never really departed" (111). However, this emphasis on place as home, and topological thinking as homecoming, must be qualified, not only in light of what we have just seen regarding ecstasis, but also in terms of Heidegger's own thinking of home. For as early as Sein und Zeit, we are told that the "not-at-home" (das Un-zuhause) must, in relation to the familiarity with oneself or to the being-at-home, "be conceived as the more primordial phenomenon,"[5] and in later texts, such as the 1942 lecture course, Hölderlin's Hymn "The Ister" (GA 53), Heidegger shows that any homecoming signifies a journeying in the foreign. Do these latter characterizations not go against the grain of Malpas' insistence on place as home and dwelling, as homecoming? How does one think together the notion of a being-at-home-in-a-place with the essentially ecstatic character of the human being? Finally, does this ecstatic expropriation not point towards a certain excess with respect to place and to being in a place, and point toward a certain being "out of place" or "without a place"? In paragraph 40 of Being and Time, Heidegger evokes the presence in anxiety of a certain nowhere"The fact that what is threatening is nowhere characterizes what anxiety is about" (SZ, 186/BT, 180). What is this nowhere, this being out of place, in relation to the return to place that Malpas emphasizes? Can one not raise here Levinas' objection to Heidegger's emphasis on dwelling as suppression of a certain errancy of an existence without a proper topos?

As we saw above, Malpas writes that, "To be is to be in place, and to be a phenomenon, in appearing, is similarly to be placed, or, as one might say, to take place" (46). This indicates that in place there is a taking place, a happening, so that place is precisely not a mere location, and perhaps not even simply what Malpas refers to as an openness or an "open region" (Heidegger's Topology, 48), but an event. Malpas tends to read the development of the thinking of place in Heidegger's work as a "shift away from the transcendental" mode of thinking, noting "Heidegger's increasingly explicit thematization of topological elements in his thinking," and hence a "movement away from the transcendental and phenomenological" (47-48). Notwithstanding the very problematic identification by Malpas (47) of the phenomenological with the transcendental (which Heidegger does not equate but distinguishes, even as early as his hermeneutics of factical life in the twenties and his critique of Husserl in the 1925History of the Concept of Time), and the equally problematic notion that Heidegger would have abandoned the phenomenological in his later work (which is not attested or supported by the texts, rather the contrary[6]), the issue remains of how to conceive of place in Heidegger's thinking. As mentioned above, Malpas understands place, not in terms of the location of some appearing, but of "a certain domain that is open so as to allow for that appearing, and yet also bounded so that the appearing is indeed an appearing of some thing" (46). Yet, isn't the issue to precisely focus on the "taking place" of place, on the event of the opening of the open? One would then reveal the eventful character of space, a project that Malpas in fact did begin to explore in his previous book, in chapter 5 of Heidegger's Topology.

Heidegger explains in the 1969 text "Art and Space" that it is a matter of inquiring about what is proper to space, that is, "the question of what space as space is" (GA 13, 205/AS, 306). In contrast with scientific space, this requires, in turn, to think space, as it were, from space itself! Let us recall here that Heidegger understood his own thinking as "tautological thinking," which as such "is the primordial sense of phenomenology" (FS, 71). "What is proper to space," Heidegger writes, "must show itself from space itself" (GA 13, 205/AS, 306). And what is proper to space? That space . . . spaces! What is ownmost [Eigenste] to space is that it spaces. "What, then, is space as space? Answer: Space spaces [der Raum räumt]."[7] What is thus most proper to space is that it spaces, the very event of spacing. It is not an openness, but the event of the opening of the open: "Spacing means clearing outmaking free, the setting free into a free area [freigeben ein Freies], an open [Offenes]. In so far as space spaces, freely gives a free area, then it first affords with this free area the possibility of regions, of nearness and farness, of directions and bounds, the possibilities of distances and magnitudes" (KPR, 13). Heidegger thus refers to space as a spacing, that is, as an event, and writes that in spacing, "a happening [ein Geschehen] at once speaks and conceals itself," that the "granting of places happens [geschieht]," and that "the character of this happening [Geschehens] is such a granting (GA 13 207/AS, 307-308). And with this motif of this happening of space, with this attempt to think space (Raum) from the event of "spacing" (Räumen) -- in fact Heidegger tells us in "Building Dwelling Thinking" (GA 7, 156/PLT 152), that "a space is something that has been spaced, or made room for" [Ein Raum ist etwas Eingeräumtes-- are we not, as it were, invited to approach space from Ereignis? Heidegger actually suggested this in On Time and Being: "Since time as well as being can only be thought fromEreignis as the gifts of Ereignis, the relation of space to Ereignis must also be considered in an analogous way," which also implies inquiring into "the origin of space" and "the singular proper being of place."[8] Thinking place as what is proper to space would then lead to consider its event from Ereignis.

These questions aside, this book constitutes another impressive achievement by Jeff Malpas in reconsidering the importance and senses of place, not only in Heidegger's work, but also more broadly in philosophy itself. With respect to Heidegger (who remains the central reference of this work), and in contrast with the traditional view that Heidegger neglected spatiality in favor of temporality, Malpas' work reveals the depth and extent of Heidegger's thinking of place, showing brilliantly how place indeed constitutes what Heidegger called an "originary phenomenon." As if echoing what Heidegger said in the 1969 text "Art and Space," namely that space should be approached as belonging to those originary phenomena [Urphänomenen], that is, a phenomenon behind which there is "nothing" to which it could be traced back (GA 13, 205/AS, 306), Malpas writes: "Space and spatiality cannot be understood as derivative of any other structure" (134). And in proximity with the motif of wonder that Malpas emphasizes, one recalls Heidegger's further comment: space is a phenomenon through "the discovery of which humans are overcome by a kind of awe, to the point of anxiety [Angst]," not only because there is nothing behind it, but also because, "in front of it, there is no evasion to something else" possible (GA 13, 205/AS, 306, tr. modified). Heidegger once wrote that "'Dasein' names that which is first of all to be experienced, and subsequently thought of accordingly, as a place (Stelle) -- namely, as the locality of the truth of Being (die Ortschaft der Wahreit des Seins)."[9] It is the merit of Malpas' new book that it helps us begin to understand this statement, as well as to enter more deeply into the mystery, and indeed the wonder, of place.

[1] "Die Kunst und der Raum," in Aus der Erfahrung des Denkens, 1910-76, GA 13, p. 205. Translated by Charles H. Seibert as "Art and Space," reprinted in The Heidegger Reader, edited by Günter Figal (Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press, 2007), p. 306. Hereafter cited as GA 13/AS.

[2] Vorträge und Aufsätze. Friedrich-Wilhelm von Herrmann (2000), GA 7, pp. 157-158. Translated by Albert Hofstadter, Poetry, Language, Thought (New York: Harper, 1975); New York: Perennial (2001), p. 155. Hereafter cited as GA 7/PLT.

[3] Martin Heidegger, Four Seminars, trans. Andrew Mitchell and François Raffoul (Bloomington and Indianapolis: Indiana University Press, 2003), p. 41. Hereafter cited as FS. For other occurrences of that expression, see FS, p. 107, note 73. Also see Malpas' own clarifications of these occurrences in Heidegger's corpus inHeidegger's Topology, p. 330, note 89.

[4] Die Grundprobleme der Phänomenologie. 2nd Edition. Ed. Friedrich-Wilhelm von Herrmann. 1989, GA 24, p. 425. English translation: The Basic Problems of Phenomenology. Revised Edition. Trans. Albert Hofstadter (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1982), p. 299, tr. modified.

[5] Martin Heidegger. Sein und Zeit, 7th edition (Tübingen: Niemeyer, 1953), p. 189. Being and Time, trans. Joan Stambaugh. Revised and with a Foreword by Dennis J. Schmidt (Albany: SUNY Press, 2010), p. 183. Hereafter cited as ZS/BT.

[6] See for instance Heidegger's remarks in The Zähringen seminar (1973) in Four Seminars where he names his final philosophy a "phenomenology of the inapparent" (FS, 80), and where he invites his interlocutors to participate in "phenomenological exercises" in order to think the matter at hand (FS, 11, 19, 22, 31-32). As he puts it, "In order to understand . . . one must see phenomenologically" (FS, 11), and in a letter to Roger Munier from April 16, 1973, he affirms: "For me it is a matter of actually performing an exercise in a phenomenology of the inapparent; by the reading of books, no one ever arrives at phenomenological 'seeing'" (FS, 89). Also, see Heidegger's preface (from 1962) to William J. Richardson's Through Phenomenology to Tbought (fourth edition, Fordham U. Press, 2003, xiv) where he takes issue with Husserl's understanding of phenomenology (precisely as connected to modern transcendental philosophy) and where he claims that his thinking of being displays "a more faithful adherence to the principle of phenomenology".

[7] Bemerkungen zu Kunst -- Plastik -- Raum, ed. Hermann Heidegger (St Gallen, Switzerland: Erker Verlag, 1996), p. 13. Hereafter cited as KPR, followed by page number.

[8] "Zeit und Sein," in GA 14. Zur Sache des Denkens (1927-1968). Ed. Friedrich-Wilhelm von Herrmann (Frankfurt am Main: Vittorio Klostermann, 2007), pp. 28-29.On Time and Being. Trans. Joan Stambaugh (New York: Harper & Row, 1972), p. 23, tr. slightly modified.

[9] Martin Heidegger. Wegmarken1919-58. GA 9, p. 202. "Introduction to 'What is Metaphysics?' "The Way Back into the Ground of Metaphysics." In Pathmarks, edited by William McNeill (Cambridge, MA: Cambridge University Press, 1998), p. 283.