Heidegger and the Will: On the Way to Gelassenheit

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Bret W. Davis, Heidegger and the Will: On the Way to Gelassenheit, Northwestern University Press, 2007, 390pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780810120358.

Reviewed by Frank Schalow, University of New Orleans


The question as to the evolution of Heidegger's concept of freedom (Freiheit) or, in this case, the transition from the will to Gelassenheit, has hovered at the periphery of the field of Heidegger studies for decades.  On the one hand, freedom as a multifaceted concept is integral to Heidegger's attempt to reask the question of being.  On the other hand, if only because of its polyvalent character, freedom is not easily thematized whether as a dimension of Dasein, or as pertaining to its understanding of being or to the manifestation of being itself.  In Heidegger and the Will, Bret W. Davis confronts this complex issue of freedom, insofar as it is expressed in various permutations of willing and the possibility of its opposite.   In the course of ten chapters, Davis sketches the development of Heidegger's account of the will, outlining a chronology culminating in his notion of freedom as Gelassenheit, as "releasement" and "letting be."

The term "Gelassenheit," which springs from the mysticism of Meister Eckhart, distinguishes Heidegger's mature understanding of freedom.  Yet the steps by which Heidegger transposes this concept from a mystical, into a philosophical context, are not always clear.  For Heidegger does not wish to predicate his philosophy on preset religious notions, since these may still be bound by the constraints of the metaphysical tradition he seeks to overcome.  In his "Introduction," Davis frames the problem this way:

Heidegger cannot, then, simply appeal to a prior definition of Gelassenheit, insofar as any prior notion would be bound to an earlier epoch in the history of metaphysics … Yet are we even today prepared to think Gelassenheit post-metaphysically, beyond the strictures of an onto-theological or subjective voluntarism? (xxiv) 

The suggestion that Heidegger not only strives to overcome voluntarism, but also that there are elements of his philosophy that inhibit his attempt to do so, constitutes the thesis of Davis's book. 

How, then, might we step back into a proper, non-willing relation of cor-respondence to being, as 'place-holders' and 'guardians' of its clearing, and thereby into a proper comportment to beings, one that cultivates and preserves them in a manner that genuinely lets them be?" (xxxi)

In the first two chapters of his book, Davis examines Heidegger's thinking from the Being and Time period, in order to establish how the issue of the will can become a concern for him, as well as the corollary possibility of how "non-willing" can emerge as a philosophical problem in its own right.  In painting a portrait of Heidegger's early phenomenology, Davis all too predictably appeals to Heidegger's concept of resoluteness (Entschlossenheit) as an example of his entanglement in a philosophy of the will.  Even in instances where Heidegger might become aware of the "voluntaristic" overtones of his concept of resolve, e.g., in addressing the possibility of owned or authentic selfhood, he nevertheless cannot "twist free" from its voluntaristic and subjectivistic overtones (56).  Because of his tie to this metaphysical tradition, Heidegger cannot purge the connotations of "willfulness" from his concept of resolve, even when he accentuates its disclosive power, e.g., in his 1942/43 lectures on Parmenides (45-46).  The date of these lectures should not go unnoticed.  For by claiming that the "later" Heidegger re-thinks the concept of resoluteness as "non-willing" disclosiveness, Davis constructs a scenario in which the "earlier" Heidegger of the 1930s cannot help but succumb to the temptations of a corollary voluntarism expressed in the area of politics.  Davis thereby comes full circle to arrive at the predictable, but not particularly illuminating conclusion (since it has been voiced for decades) that Heidegger's philosophy of resoluteness directly aligns with the self-affirmation of the will in National Socialism.

In Chapter Three, Davis then makes explicit the direction of his argument:

While Heidegger's resolute decision to support Hitler's political will in 1933 cannot be simply deduced from his 1930 philosophical affirmation of 'pure factical willing,' his philosophical embrace of the will certainly did help free the way for his political commitment.  When we look back to Being and Time, it is yet more difficult to ascertain the extent to which Heidegger's philosophy led him toward his political disaster and the extent to which Heidegger failed to live up to the critical possibilities of his philosophy when he lapsed into participation with the politics of willful resolve. (82-83)

Though one could debate at length the extent of Heidegger's involvement in National Socialism, Davis's peculiar phraseology is especially troubling.  For, having at least faintly suggested that for Heidegger resoluteness can mean the "unlocking" of a "free-space" of de-cision, Davis then abruptly reduces this concept of resolve to its metaphysical analogue, i.e., "willful resolve."  When it seems expedient to jump on the bandwagon of Heidegger's critics, Davis construes Heidegger's concepts one way, even though the salient texts suggest a completely different manifestation of the phenomena at issue.  The difficulty with Davis's approach is that it lends itself to faulty generalizations, while at the same time ignoring the subtleties in the unfolding and radicalization of Heidegger's hermeneutics.

Having endorsed the view that Heidegger's latent voluntarism leads him down the errant path of National Socialism, Davis then argues the equally dubious corollary that a "turn" occurred in Heidegger's thinking whereby he embraced a non-voluntaristic form of resoluteness.  Davis roughly correlates this "turning" (die Kehre) with Heidegger's composition of his seminal text, Contributions to Philosophy (From Enowning).  What Heidegger calls "reservededness" as a supposed "restraining" of the will constitutes a "positive sense" thereof as "letting be," "in distinction from a self-assertive sense of the will" (92).  Yet even as important as Heidegger's insight in this text supposedly is, Davis claims that "Contributions still vacillates between leaving the will behind and uncovering its most proper sense" (98).

In chapters four through seven, Davis then sets the stage for (1) developing Heidegger's critique of voluntarism through his critique of Nietzsche's concept of the will to power and (2) explaining the role that Heidegger's adaptation of Eckhart's concept of Gelassenheit plays as the key for thinking being non-metaphysically, that is, apart from the imposition of the will in the manipulative forces of modern technology.  With Nietzsche's metaphysics of the will as a counter point, Heidegger seeks a "middle-voice" expression of the will as the median between activity and passivity.  Eckhart's concept of Gelassenheit as "releasement" provides such a candidate of willing, which equally includes the possibility of "non-willing."

There is nevertheless, as we have seen, a genuinely radical thrust to Eckhart's thought that leaves both 'God' and his Will behind.  Eckhart intimates a passage through utter passivity that gives way to a birth of 'pure activity' without a subject or an object, that is, to the spontaneous generosity of living 'without why.' (134)

Despite this religious context, the will can still emerge without being induced by the initiative of a higher power, or a transcendent causation of the will, including God.

Here, then, is Eckhart at his most radical, where absolute passivity paradoxically releases one into an originary freedom for 'pure activity.'  This freedom of living without why, beyond the dictates of God's Will as well as the desire of self-will, manifests itself in a 'pure [egoless and nonwilling] activity' that would lie beyond the horizon of activity and passivity, having radically stepped back out of Heidegger's 'domain of the will.' (135)

Having uncovered the key to developing Heidegger's mature concept of freedom, Davis then shows how this insight joins with the "saving grace" (Friedrich Hölderlin), which "releases" human beings from the "danger" of "willful technological manipulation" (184).

In the concluding four chapters of his book, Davis counter balances his claim that in his later writings Heidegger takes steps to "twist free" from the metaphysical constraints of the will, and yet continues to harbor vestiges of it through the inadequacy of his politics.

How is man to participate in the transition from the epoch that determines his nature as will to a time when he would be released into non-willing?  How can we leave behind that by which we are still determined?  We have stressed the radical difference between the (domain of the) will and non-willing; but it is the very radicality of this difference which makes the transition so enigmatic. (210-211)

Ostensibly, the historical transformation whereby Da-sein belongs to being, and receives its claim (Anspruch) -- rather than "man" as a "subject" serving the impulse of willfulness -- would be a relevant consideration in addressing this question.  Such is the thrust of Heidegger's discussion in Contributions to Philosophy of the "undecidability of de-cision," which holds open the possibility of this transformation by rooting Da-sein in what is "ownmost" in its earthly sojourn.  But instead of considering how Er-eignis reopens the domain of the human apart from any determinate "essence," by directing "man" to what is ownmost in his reciprocity to being, Davis invokes a strange brand of metaphysical "essentialism" that contradicts his search for a "post-metaphysical" expression of the will.  "

The human essence is not only historical in the sense of being determined historically, man is also historical in that he is in all times called on to essentially participate in this historical determining …  Man is, in short, non-historically historical. (212) 

Operating according to this "essentialist" premise, Davis then claims that a direct confrontation with the danger of technology demands that humanity in its deepest "essence" relinquish its will, and then cultivate the opposite possibility of non-willing. 

It is precisely this intimation of an 'innermost,' 'indestructible' and 'free essence' of man, which exceeds the modern historical delimitation of his essence as will, that would enable a human participation in the transition to an other beginning of non-willing. (213)

Having made this dubious alliance with essentialism, Davis then concludes his study by revisiting the link between Heidegger's philosophy and the politics of National Socialism.  Even if we assume the possibility of relinquishing the will, there is still a question of how a place (Ort) can be reserved for politics, which yields to the historical claim of being on the one hand without capitulating to the will of authoritarian rule on the other.  "There is, in fact, a certain troubling continuity between the notion of the Volk or the nation in Heidegger's political writings of the early 1930s and the notion of the history of being is his mature texts," thereby suggesting that there is the return of a "residual element" of the will in Heidegger's thought (261-262).  According to Davis, Heidegger's philosophy is then caught in a vexing ambivalence between its attempt to "twist free" from the "domain of the will," and yet instill a sense of decisiveness about the direction of humanity's future (273).  Davis then concludes by reiterating the subtitle of his book that we can only be "on the way to Gelassenheit," albeit through a "non-willing" that seems to resonate more with the paradoxes of Zen, than with the language of being-historical thinking (303).

Davis's inadvertent lapse into "essentialism," not to mention his presumption of Heidegger's "residual" voluntarism, suggest a tendency to impose an external framework upon his thinking.  Moreover, other problems arise when Davis nuances his account by claiming that occasionally Heidegger "twists free" from the shackles of voluntarism.  The term "twisting free," which may have had a certain novelty when it emerged in the literature as far back as 1985 (See John Sallis, "Meaning Adrift," Heidegger Studies, Vol. 1,  p. 91), harbors a troubling ambiguity when Davis employs it in the context of his discussion of the will.  For within the English language, the specific sense attached to the phrase "twisting free" includes "emancipation," thereby harboring the same voluntaristic connotation of "willing" that Davis criticizes.  As a result, Davis creates an ambiguity by wedding this more vernacular sense of freedom (in English) with a more distinctly philosophical (if not "technical") sense, vis-à-vis Eckhart and Heidegger (in German), implying the opposite of "letting be" and "releasement."  However finely one may attempt to carve these various distinctions, the ambiguity which Davis fosters is really a symptom of a larger problem, namely, that he never addresses the radical way in which Heidegger formulates the question of freedom throughout the course of his entire thought.

In Heidegger and the Will, Davis points to various elements in Heidegger's account of Gelassenheit, without ever (1) developing their importance in light of the larger question of freedom or (2) showing how this question is already in play in the development and radicalization of Heidegger's hermeneutics, rather than only originating with the so-called later, "mature" writings.  As a result, Davis assumes a false chronology that throughout his entire philosophy Heidegger combats a "residual" voluntarism, occasionally extricating himself from it except, of course, when this voluntarism can be conveniently invoked as the explanation for his politics.  Whenever attempts are made to assimilate Heidegger's thought to preconceived models of interpretation, there can never be a satisfactory outcome.  Ultimately, Davis's book is another example of the reductionistic interpretations of Heidegger's philosophy that are common today, but in the end have very little merit.