Heidegger, Authenticity and the Self: Themes From Division Two of Being and Time

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Denis McManus (ed.), Heidegger, Authenticity and the Self: Themes From Division Two of Being and Time, Routledge, 2015, 283pp., $49.95 (pbk), 9780415672702.

Reviewed by Joe Balay, Christopher Newport University


This anthology grew out of a series of workshops in England (Essex, Oxford, Southampton) investigating the concepts of authenticity and selfhood in Heidegger's early magnum opus. Building on these workshops, the collection brings together an array of established Heidegger scholars and new voices, including Hubert Dreyfus, Daniel Dahlstrom, Taylor Carman, and Charles Guignon, in an effort to develop critical discussion of the Second Division of Being and Time.

In his introduction, Denis McManus observes that the critical reception of Being and Time, particularly in the analytic tradition, has largely been restricted to Division One, wherein Heidegger challenges the twin emphases of traditional metaphysics (objectivity and presence) with a historically framed pragmatism that re-situates meaning and being within an inherited, engaged, and projected set of relations. McManus suggests that whether one agrees with Heidegger or not, the concepts examined in Division One are generally acknowledged as "recognizably philosophical: subjectivity, knowledge, language, meaning, etc." (1). By contrast, he observes that Division Two's focus on concepts like authenticity, guilt, and death has had a less favorable critical reception, viewed in the continental tradition "as committed to notions of identity and selfhood that we have learned -- partly by reading Division One -- to abandon" (1), and in the analytic tradition, "as deeply puzzling, their very intent hard to gauge" (1).

Over against this criticism and neglect, the present collection proposes to reconsider the significance of Division Two, unpacking its place in the wider trajectory of Being and Time, its intellectual kinship with other key figures in the history of philosophy, and its relationship to more traditional concepts "such as intentionality, normativity, responsibility, and autonomy" (2). The anthology opens with a short piece by Guignon, situating Division Two and its notion of authenticity within the framework of Being and Time. The proceeding essays fall roughly into two groups. The first takes a comparative approach, investigating the philosophical overlap between Heidegger and thinkers ranging from Aristotle to Luther to Kierkegaard to Sartre. Here we find contributions by such thinkers as Clare Carlisle, Stephen Mulhall, Peter Poellner, Katherine Withy, and George Pattison. The second examines questions of method and methodologically key concepts such as guilt, anxiety, and death. Here we have contributions by William Blattner, Taylor Carman, Daniel Dahlstrom, Sophia Dandelet, and Hubert Dreyfus among others.

As the ongoing publication of Heidegger's collected works (Gesamtausgabe) demonstrates, it is exceedingly important to understand that work in its broader context. Accordingly, the goal of this collection to help elucidate the critical significance of the oft-misunderstood Division Two is an important one. To this end, perhaps no essay is more immediately useful than Guignon's "Authenticity and the question of being." Guignon offers a concise overview of how the Second Division and its core concept of authenticity (Eigentlichkeit) fit within both the whole of Being and Time and the broader phenomenological tradition. Guignon begins by explaining that while the German terms eigen and eigentlich mean "really," "truly," or "properly," eigentlich is used in a technical sense by Brentano and Husserl to refer to the fulfillment of an intentional act. In the context of Being and Time, however, Heidegger re-situates this notion of phenomenological intentionality in Dasein's basic temporal manner of being-in-the-world. In Division One, this is laid out according to the largely unreflective way that Dasein participates in the everyday meanings and goals of its surrounding world. In Division Two, however, Heidegger introduces the notion of authenticity (Eigentlichkeit) as a modification of this ordinary modality of intentionality, wherein Dasein "really" "owns" (eigen) or takes responsibility for these intentional acts (8, 14, 16).

In order to situate these moves more foundationally, Guignon reminds the reader that Heidegger's overarching question in Being and Time is about the meaning of Being (Sein) as such. However, insofar as the meaning of Being always presupposes some specific understanding of Being, Heidegger suggests we must first start with an analysis of the conditions of the possibility of such understanding, which he contends belongs uniquely to human being or Dasein. Division One should be seen then as an exploration of the everyday way that Dasein has this kind of understanding via its historically pragmatic manner of being-in-the-world. In turn, Division Two offers a still more fundamental explanation of how this understanding is possible, namely through an explication of how Dasein's existential relation with its death opens up the temporal horizons within which meaningful possibilities may be projected. Guignon concludes that it is precisely through this authentic confrontation with its finitude that Dasein is said to gain an existentiell insight into the existential whole of its being, and thus that Heidegger fulfills the preparatory existential analysis for his larger ontological investigation.

The better essays in this collection build on the foundation that Guignon provides. For example, Dahlstrom's "Authenticity and the absence of death" begins by echoing Guignon's reminder that in Being and Time, "Heidegger puts existential analysis in the service of the project of fundamental ontology," and it is the failure to mark this that has been "the source of much confusion about it" (150). Dahlstrom goes on to clarify that Heidegger's goal in the unpublished Second Half of the text was to show that traditional metaphysics erroneously privileges objectivity and presence, over against which the partially completed First Half shows the neglected and ultimately more foundational way of understanding these relations. Following this clarification, Dahlstrom provides a lucid interpretation of how Heidegger's existential conceptions of death and authenticity in Division Two contribute to the methodological solution of this task. This is set up in Division One, where it is seen that beings are not first and foremost disclosed as objectively present beings (vorhanden), but as part of the unthematized nexus of pragmatic relations in which they are historically embedded (zuhanden). In turn, the goal of Division Two is not simply to show that Dasein can be related to this historical disclosure of beings in different ways (e.g., inauthentic vs. authentic), but to show that the temporality of such disclosure takes place at a more fundamental level than presence, one that includes absence, the past, and the deferred future.

Dahlstrom observes that this sense of absence is most explicit in Dasein's existential relation with its death, a relation that cannot be understood as the biological termination of life (perishing/Verenden), or the biographical decline of a life (demise/Ableben). Rather, Dahlstrom clarifies that from an existential perspective, it is only because Dasein is a finite being that maintains a constant relationship with its death within the very time of its life that it is capable of exhibiting a care structure (Sorge) for that life. Put otherwise, it is only because one's death serves as the ever-present "possibility of no longer being possible" that it simultaneously opens up the various possibilities for a meaningful existence (152). As Division One shows, however, this insight typically remains concealed and forgotten by Dasein in its existentiell comportment. Dahlstrom explains that the significance of the discussion of authenticity in Division Two, then, is that it names the manner in which Dasein is capable of confronting this existential insight within the concrete comportment of its exisentiell life. In this way, Heidegger achieves factical evidence for what would otherwise be only an abstraction, namely an insight into the whole of its being and its temporal significance.

On the comparative side of things, contributions by Mulhall and Stephan Käufer stand out. Mulhall's "Nothingness and phenomenology: the co-disclosure of Sartre and Heidegger" offers an incisive reading of the conceptual role that nothingness and nihilation play in Heidegger and Sartre, attending to the potential influence of the former on the latter, and the respective differences in their projects. Similarly, Käufer's article, "Jaspers, limit-situations, and the methodological function of authenticity," investigates Jaspers' influence on the composition of Being and Time, while attending to the methodological divide between the two thinkers.

Following the latter piece in some detail here, Käufer departs from Heidegger's 1919 review of Jaspers' Psychologie der Weltanschauungen, noting that Heidegger's review affords "an early glimpse of many of the main themes of Division Two," and "showcases a kernel of unity that ties together the apparently disjointed chapters of Division Two" (95). Käufer argues that Heidegger recognizes in Jaspers' provocative concept of limit-situations the seeds of his own existential investigation, while distancing himself from Jaspers' psychological and objective approach. Käufer explains that, on Heidegger's reading, Jaspers is on the right track in that he "intends" the proper phenomena, but fails to adequately "grasp" it, a critique that helps set up Heidegger's own methodology in Being and Time (101). This is seen in the way that Division One points to or "indicates" the existential character of Dasein's everyday manner of being engaged in the inherited relations of the world. In Division Two, however, Heidegger traces the limit-situations of anxiety, guilt, and death to detail how authentic Dasein moves to an explicit, ontological "grasp" of this existential-temporal being. In this way, Heidegger proposes to solve the methodological problem that he first notes in his book review on Jaspers.

The strengths of the essays cited above also offer some insight into the relative shortcomings elsewhere in the collection. On the comparative side in particular, a number of authors fall into the trap of arguing that x did it first, or y did it better, while others take up Heidegger's work only incidentally. For instance, Poellner's "Early Heidegger and Sartre on authenticity" is a truly first-rate Sartre essay, but only addresses Heidegger briefly. Elsewhere, in "A tale of two footnotes: Heidegger and the question of Kierkegaard," Carlisle rightfully highlights Heidegger's failure to sufficiently acknowledge his intellectual debt to Kierkegaard, but goes on to suggest that Heidegger simply "reactivates Kierkegaard's solution to an explicitly Christian dilemma concerning historicity and freedom" (52), a suggestion that leads her to wonder whether Heidegger's work "produces something new" (53). While it is clear that such comparative analysis is important in helping establish the wider philosophical significance of Division Two, it is equally important to explore how Heidegger understands himself to be departing from these similarities, a question that is sometimes underdeveloped in these comparative pieces.

This narrower objection ultimately points to a larger reservation I have about the paucity of reflection on both the composition of Division Two, and its place in Heidegger's wider project. Indeed, while a number of articles (e.g., Carman, Blattner, Mark Wrathall, Dandelet and Dreyfus) cover important current debates surrounding the conceptual interpretation of Being and Time and touch on certain methodological considerations, there is very little discussion of the architectural plan of Being and Time or how Heidegger carried out and revised this plan following its partial completion (for instance, in the immediately proceeding The Basic Problems of Phenomenology (1927), and later, in his historical turn (Kehre) beginning in the 1930's). McManus and Guignon's opening essays preview some of these questions and are helpful in this regard, but their analysis is necessarily too restricted to accomplish this. While it may be objected that such demands fall outside the scope of a specific examination of Division Two, I would argue that these considerations would go a long way toward disabusing the critical dismissal of Division Two as a naïve discourse on subjectivity, and toward clarifying its situated goals, accomplishments, and failures within the proper scope of Heidegger's project.

These closing objections aside, this book constitutes an important call to rethink the under-recognized Second Division of Being and Time, and offers a number of provocative suggestions about how we might begin to take up such thinking. It is a timely and useful volume, bringing together a host of important voices in Heidegger scholarship today, and supporting the task of a more considered and complex understanding of Heidegger's work.