Heidegger, History and the Holocaust

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Mahon O'Brien, Heidegger, History and the Holocaust, Bloomsbury, 2015, 192pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781472510198.

Reviewed by Theodore Kisiel, Northern Illinois University


The controversy over Heidegger's political engagement in his Nazi years has routinely polarized itself into two extreme camps: those who "amplify his Nazism and diminish his stature as a philosopher" (p. 1) to nil (Victor Farías, Richard Wolin, Emmanuel Faye et al.) and the ultra-orthodox Heideggerians who view his Nazism as at most a brief dalliance and unequivocally proclaim his greatness as a philosopher. The author's argument in this book assumes a position midway between these extremes by thetically positing that Heidegger is both a great philosopher and a committed Nazi. Mahon O'Brien takes from Heidegger the philosopher a deep appreciation of "the gift of my thrownness" (p. x) into the historical world. O'Brien was born and raised in a valley in the West of Ireland, and its temporal particularity accordingly gives him a unique sense of his own history.  He also has an intense feeling of belonging to his thrown community and a profound wonder that reaches down into the sounds, sights, and scents emanating "from my home, and yes, from my native soil . . . Suddenly a profound universal humanism seemed to speak to me from Heidegger's work in a way which was particular to me and my locale and yet opened up a door to human beings in general" (p. 4).

But Heidegger the Nazi takes these same insights in a very dangerous direction and exploits the same central concepts in the service of a noxious political vision. Especially the central concept of Bodenständigkeit, which is defined by a strong autochthonous sense of an aboriginal community being indigenously rooted in the land that it inhabits and claims as its very own native soil, is perverted by Heidegger into exclusionary and prejudicial directions by way of the perspectives of a narrow provincialism and an ethnic chauvinism. His provincialism is on full display in his identifying the proper historicity of the German people to be rooted in the local, often peasant customs and traditions of its native world and native soil, charged with allusions to Nazi Blut-und-Boden rhetoric. As Heidegger puts it in a 1934 Vita, he "stems from allemannisch-schwäbisch peasant stock, on my mother's side residing on the same farmland uninterruptedly since 1510" (GA 16: 247). According to O'Brien, his ethnic chauvinism is especially evident in his treatment of the Jewish community, when "in the death camps . . . their historicity was denied them -- a community, moreover, that he insists in a 1933-34 seminar, are without history and thereby lack the capacity to belong to a state or to be authentic German citizens."[1]

There are several misconstruals underlying this strongest of O'Brien's formulations of Heidegger's ethnic chauvinism. First, his statement is a heavy-handed over-interpretation of a cluster of student seminar protocols and not necessarily Heidegger's own words. Next, traits like being 'historyless" and "worldless" are not being inflicted upon the Jewish communities in the death camps but rather, according to Heidegger's conspiratorial version of anti-Semitism, are the traits self-imposed by the international alliance of Jews which, through technological machination, conspires to take over the world economy by seizing control of the media and financial institutions of the most advanced national economies.[2] Be it scientific objectification or its close cousin technological machination, already the early phenomenological Heidegger exposes their devastating effects upon our most original life experience, serving to dehistoricize (entgeschichtlichen) it, to unworld (entwelten) it, to unlive (entleben) it, and to designify (entdeuten) it (GA 56/57: 89-91). Finally, O'Brien regards Heidegger's viral anti-modernism as the source of his questioning the universality of human experience in favor of the particularity that follows from his extreme provincialism. It is true that Heidegger had a running argument against the generic and common universal, which is applicable to all indiscriminately and uniformly. But this was only to highlight the hermeneutically distributive and proper universal which is applicable to each individually in accord with the unique temporal context in which each individual or community interprets its existential and historical situation. The same point is repeatedly made in Being and Time, in the distinction between categories and existentials, between the what-question and who-question, between the uniform anyone-self and the proper self of a unique and one-time-only lifetime. Such hermeneutic concepts are meant to call each and every individual to become resolutely open to the full facticity of its proper historical situation, its Da-sein, and to take over its own thrownness by transmitting the most relevant of its inherited possibilities to itself, in order to be there in the timely moment of decision for its time and its generation. This creative repetition of our own tradition and heritage involves its interpretation and reinterpretation in accord with the holistic context of the particular historical situation into which each of us happens to have been thrown, which then leads to our transforming ourselves into the ownmost Da-sein within ourselves, the epitome of authenticity and the attainment of our most proper selves. And as both Heidegger and O'Brien repeatedly point out, this authentication of our own proper historicity is the locus of our most basic political as well as existential decisions.

Our author is relentlessly fierce in his judgment of Heidegger's political decisions and their consequences, identifying them as ruthlessly opportunistic, contemptible, despicable, repugnant, and loathsome. But there is one particularly gruesome example, Heidegger's "agricultural remark," where O'Brien comes to the great philosopher's defense against the deafening roar of "misdirected indignation" mounted by countless outraged critics: "Agriculture is now a mechanized food industry, in essence the same as the production of corpses in the gas chambers and extermination camps, the same as the blockading and starving of countries, the same as the production of hydrogen bombs." (GA 79: 27)

To begin with, O'Brien reminds us of Heidegger's lifelong penchant to consistently steer clear of all forms of ethics and moral anthropology in order to explore a phenomenological dimension that precedes and underlies such issues. Then he recalls a somewhat less provocative and yet current example of the technically proficient production of food, namely, the slaughtering of livestock in the conveyor tracks of factory farms. Factory farming, nuclear bombs, mass starvation by blockade, and the Holocaust: all of these more or less gross examples receive their common sameness from the essence of modern technology, Ge-Stell, the com-positioning of resources standing in reserve ready for use or misuse/abuse. In our technological age, everything in the technical world, including ourselves, is revealed to be standing reserves, resources or stock to be produced and consumed as well as ever disposable.

We can agree that Heidegger's insight into the essence of modern technology as Ge-Stell proves to be prescient when extended to our own more technically advanced 21st century and so provides an illustration of his genius as a philosopher. Best translated out of its Greek and Latin roots as "syn-thetic com-posit[ion]ing," Ge-Stell portends the 21st century globalizations of the internetted WorldWideWeb with its virtual infinity of websites in cyberspace, Global Positioning Systems (GPS), interlocking air traffic control grids, world-embracing weather maps, the 24-7 world news cycle of cable TV-networks like CNN, etc., etc., all of which are structured by the complex programming based on the computerized and ultimately simple Leibnizian binary-digital logic generating an infinite number of combinations of the posit (1) and non-posit (0). The synthetic compositing of computer logic thus maps out the grand artifact of the technological infrastructure that networks the entire globe of our planet Earth. Nonetheless, O'Brien's defense of Heidegger's infamous agricultural remark completely "brackets out" the enormous moral gap between modern agricultural practices and the genocidal murder of human beings. Any similarity in the technology used is outweighed by the evil of the result.

Even after defending Heidegger for his infamous agricultural remark, O'Brien turns the same set of texts back on Heidegger in accusing him of being complicit with the Nazis in denying the Jews "their potentially authentic historical community" as historical human beings, finally even denying them their freedom-toward-death in the direst of circumstances. The flaw in this line of thought about communities only gradually becomes apparent when Heidegger's refusal "to see these people [the Jews] themselves as similarly claimed by the temporal and historical conditions which he was subject to" is juxtaposed with "the personal and often significantly more than cordial nature of the relationship between Heidegger and numerous Jewish intellectuals" (p. 94). For there are Jews and there are Jews, and the specificity of the anti-Semitism that emerges from the publication of the Black Notebooks in the '30s is in its single-minded focus clearly directed against the presumed conspiratorial bent of world Jewry. So stealthy and sinister are the operations of this "dangerous" international alliance of Jews that Heidegger at one point considers whether this shadowy group should not be counted among the global arch-criminals of our century.[3] In an essay written in 1940, he notes that "die planetarischen Hauptverbrecher der neuesten Neuzeit" ("the global arch-criminals of the most recent modernity") in their capacity for brutality and overwhelming will to power, "can be counted on the fingers of one hand" (GA 69: 78).[4] Heidegger's select company of global arch-criminals of the 20th century would certainly have included Hitler and at least Stalin, with the possible supplement of a global Jewish cabal working stealthily and conspiratorially behind the scenes of the world stage.

[1] Mahon O'Brien, "Misadventures in Political Philosophy," theForum Newsletter, a 2016 online article.

[2] Underlying this conspiratorial anti-Semitism is the fictional story of the Protocols of the Elders of Zion, which Hitler in his speeches regularly recited as if it were a fact. Hannah Arendt called this story of a Jewish world conspiracy "the most efficient fiction of Nazi propaganda."

[3] Peter Trawny, Heidegger und der Mythos der jüdischen Weltverschwörung (Klostermann, 2014), pp. 51-52.

[4] Martin Heidegger, Die Geschichte des Seyns, Gesamtausgabe Volume 69 (Klostermann, 1998), p. 78.