Heidegger on Death: A Critical Theological Essay

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George Pattison, Heidegger on Death: A Critical Theological Essay, Ashgate, 2013, 170pp., $34.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781409466957.

Reviewed by Jeffrey L. Kosky, Washington and Lee University


George Pattison describes his book as a critical theological reflection on death in the wake of modernity. It reflects on the meaning death can have today in human existence in general and Christian existence more particularly. But it is just as much a reflection on life and the meaning human being might or might not possess when confronted with the peculiar forms of the modern determination of death.

To conduct these reflections, Pattison proposes to meditate seriously on the thinker who perhaps more than any modern philosopher "articulate[s] something central to the modern conception of being human" (4): Martin Heidegger. What makes Heidegger's reflection on the human condition distinctive for Pattison is "the persistent rigor with which [it] thinks through the human condition in the perspective of its thrownness toward death" (4). In Heidegger, the modern dismissal of belief in life after death achieves consummate expression in a philosophy that is prepared to contemplate, without flinching, "the scandal of the entire annihilation of self and world" (5).

Pattison has chosen his interlocutor wisely.

The scandal raised by this conception of the human condition is, of course, the utter ruin of every enterprise of meaning-making. The threat of nihilism seems to run high when every aspiration begins in the contingency of thrown being-in-the-world and ends in the nothingness of death. But Heidegger is not easily positioned as a nihilist, and his philosophy resists easy characterization as a "philosophy of death." While Pattison does not make either charge in those exact terms, his account might invite such a reading. Readers should keep this in mind. Abandoning an otherworldly aspiration or divine telos of human existence does not destroy the phenomenon of the world, and much of Heidegger's thinking is an effort to recall this phenomenon of world and with it the human being that inheres in it. In this way, it provides a leading example of what could be called a secular turn of human thought and existence, a turn to the world or saeculum, as distinct from a turn away from the world often associated with certain forms of theological otherworldliness or otherworldly theology.

Heidegger's secular turn re-discovers something like the question of the significance of existence. Being-in-the-world, he shows, is structured in such a way that the question of significance is inhabited when existence takes up its being in the world authentically. This authentic taking up of existence thrown toward death happens in anticipatory resoluteness, the Macquarrie-Robinson translation of vorlaufende Entschlossenheit, which Pattison frequently renders, not unreasonably, though not inconsequentially either, as "resolute running ahead toward death." On Pattison's reading, then, Heidegger represents the distinctly modern condition in which the aspiration to eternal life with God has been replaced by resolutely running toward death as the realization of authentic human selfhood. For Heidegger, the existence of such a self, though void of divine aspiration, is not without significance; indeed hearing the call to authentic existence represents a turning toward the networks of significance that Heidegger believed was the world and human inherence in it. Pattison, in opposition, does not believe that this determination of selfhood allows for the question of meaning or authenticity to be answered in a satisfying way.

This is where Pattison's reading of Heidegger becomes critical. His objections purport to target not the determination of death as nothingness, but rather the form of human existence characterized by the primacy Heidegger accords to resolute running ahead toward death. They can be summarized, I believe, in this way: authentic existence in Heideggerian terms is without hope or gratitude, overly heroic or self-determined, and, most significantly, incapable of love or ethical regard for others.

Readers should understand what is implied in these claims. For if what is distinctive about Heidegger's philosophy is its secular turn, then Pattison is in effect suggesting that love is a secular impossibility, that hope is a secular impossibility, that authentic being with others is impossible to work out within the horizon opened by a resolutely secular turn, especially as such a turn is exemplified in Heidegger's thought of being in the world.

Pattison's objections are made from two perspectives or points of view, each of which, it is worth noting, appears to give him access to the same charges.

The first perspective is confessedly Christian. It forms the expressed intention of the book's critical thrust. What are "the objections that a Christian response to Heidegger must make if it is to be true to its sources and its hope" (4)? This then gives voice to the constructive intention of the book as it "works its way towards the hope and gratitude with which a Christian response to death must begin" (7). The specifically Christian perspective and the constructive intention that proceeds from it is marked further by declarations such these: "Read in the perspective of Christian ethics, this is problematic" (94), and "For Christian faith such words of faithfulness and hope also anticipate and are, in their own way, expressive of another Word" (125).

Such phrases indicate that Pattison is speaking from a position already defined by truths presented in Christianity. This gives him secure truths by which to measure and assess the Heideggerian account of human existence, and in this assessment, the Heidggerian account just doesn't measure up. Pattison's invocation of Christianity thus affords him a fair amount of critical leverage and power, as it gives him knowledge and terms in which to level such a critique.

I have no objections to speaking from a perspective, and I have no criticism to make of Christian truths. I want only to point out how Pattison's book performs or enacts, I would say, a difference between, on one hand, a certain form of the secular turn, in which existence comes into and remains a question, and, on the other hand, a certain form of Christian belief, in which the question of existence has been settled or resolved. Someone lacking in Pattison's commitment to established truths, or someone who does not have secure access to knowledge of what it means to be a Christian or, more generally, of what it means to be, finds herself in want of the language and knowledge that would settle, put to rest, or resolve the question as it is raised by Heidegger.

Pattison's Christian response is developed largely through readings of Fyodor Dostoyevsky, Martin Luther and Søren Kierkegaard, in particular Luther's pastoral works and Kierkegaard's edifying discourses. Pattison notes that these Christian authors are the ones Heidegger was reading in the early formative years when he developed the account of human existence as "mortal anxiety" (85-6). The theologians' account of the sinful condition of human existence culminating in death provided Heidegger with ontic evidence for developing his own account of human being-in-the-world as abandonment to death. But, Pattison contends, Heidegger omits from his reading of these authors precisely what would make the meditation on death and human nothingness into a transformative event, one generative of human meaning. These omissions concern chiefly reference to the divine and a theology of Creation, making for what Pattison calls "a secularized version of radical Protestant theology" (86) -- evidence again of Heidegger's secular turn.

More particularly, what Pattison finds in the theologians is that a confrontation with the nothingness of the human self is managed not by the encounter with death as it is in Heidegger, but by the self's being before God, coram deo. Confrontation with the divine creator brings the self to realize its own nothingness as a creature entirely and forever dependent on an other for its existence. Creature status, then, undoes the autonomy of the existential self more radically than does confrontation with thrownness toward death because the creature will never be able to overcome the passivity of its creation, whereas existing Dasein, Pattison contends (similarly to Emmanuel Levinas), does transform the passivity of its thrownness toward death into the basis for existential comprehension when it takes up this passivity in resolutely running ahead toward death. This change in the event in which authentic selfhood is realized has important consequences for the determination of the fundamental mood of human being: whereas the resolute taking up of human existence as Dasein thrown toward death happens in a mood of anxiety (Heidegger), the authentic realization of the human condition as creature happens in a mood of hope and gratitude (Luther, Kierkegaard, and Pattison), for the creature realizes her own nothingness in the face of the one who saves her and to whom she is therefore thankful. This, I think, makes the realization of authentic nothingness somewhat convenient in that it is at once redeemed.

At least for the Christian it is, but Heidegger's secular turn has omitted from his reading of Christian sources precisely what Pattison contends makes it possible for existence to be affected in such hopeful and thankful ways. This difference is at the heart of Pattison's theological critique of Heidegger: existence thrown toward death gives no ground for hope, while Christian existence created by and for God does include hope.

But is hope really a secular impossibility? And is hope (Christian or otherwise) so sure of its future? To my ears, the hope Pattison describes sounds at times more like the expectation of what it knows will come -- a future present, indeed a good one (life after death, a God who saves, and so on), expected with certainty because founded on an encounter already experienced (the God who saved). The worry or anxious concern that accompanies hope often seems pressed out of Pattison's account. But one might want to distinguish hope from expectation and contend that hope becomes meaningful when the future is unknown and indeterminate, that the nothingness of death is therefore the ground of hope, not its opposite but what calls for it: only a being aware of future nothingness hopes to be. Dasein's resoluteness, then, would not be desperate or despairing running-ahead-to-death, but in anticipating the nothingness of death, would expose us to that which makes hope a meaningful existential possibility.

The second perspective from which Pattison objects to Heidegger is not explicitly theological or religious, but aspires to a phenomenological legitimacy that would be of general or perhaps universal human significance. "A closer phenomenological reading of our relations to the dead than Heidegger himself offers" (125), Pattison claims, shows that in assigning being toward death the exclusive role in determining authentic understanding of human existence, Heidegger fails to portray correctly "the defining characteristics of human Dasein in the here and now" (14).

The failed characterization of "human Dasein in the here and now" revolves around Heidegger's account of resoluteness (vorlaufende Entschlossenheit). Pattison points out that the resolution required for taking up our thrown existence in running ahead toward death is rare, indeed foreign to our human condition. The far more authentically human response is cowering, sticking your head in the sand, and crying -- "crying his very I out" as Franz Rosenzweig put it (56). We come to authentic existence not in running ahead toward our own death, but in our desire "just to remain, to stay alive" (57) and in the love and pity we show to our fellow men who suffer the same fear and share the same desire. Human weakness in the face of death does not condemn existence to inauthenticity and insignificance, according to Pattison, for our being is constituted most fundamentally in connection with others whose pain we feel as ours and whose death we suffer as our own loss. Works of love, rituals of grieving, and words of consolation in which the existence of the self is bound up with others thus realize authentic selfhood, according to Pattison, without demanding the heroism of the isolated, reticent I running ahead resolutely toward death without the community of others.

Accounts of the trials of faith offer far better testimony to authentic human existence, Pattison contends, than does Heidegger's account of Dasein'sheroic resoluteness. For what religious life teaches us is that "even life's decisive moments turn out to be not so decisive after all" (75). Life remains to be lived after the moment of decision, and the temptations to stray must be resisted again and again. Dostoyevsky's Alyosha must confront doubts that arise with the rotting corpse of the beloved holy man, Father Zossima, and Abraham can always turn back as he ascends Mount Moriah. And, Pattison adds, "the same might be said of the face to face with death" (75). He intends this remark to be critical of Heidegger -- who Pattison claims argues that, in resolute anticipation of death, Dasein gains "a conclusive view of its own life" (54) and comes to be itself finally and definitively, as it truly is as a whole. This supposed Heideggerian selfsame self-constancy, being-as-a-whole, is not true to life or human existence, Pattison objects, for resoluteness will always unravel in time, leaving Dasein doomed to inauthentic existence. There is no triumphant act of resolution in which I would decide myself once and for all and then maintain myself as myself throughout the whole of my life. Indeed such a resolution would be ethically dangerous insofar as it would make for a selfsame self closed to otherness and unaffected by others.

Now all this might hold as critique of Heidegger's existential analysis if it were really his position. I don't believe it is. The problems focus on the interpretation of anticipatory resoluteness. Pattison is, I acknowledge, in good company in offering the reading he does of the resoluteness of conscientious Dasein. His objections parallel those of Jean-Luc Marion, who interprets anticipatory resoluteness as 'autarky' and a form of self-possession, and they are heard in Levinas, who argues that in converting existential thrownness into project, anticipatory resoluteness makes existence a self-grounding principal unalterable and closed to the other. But it is far from clear to me that these readings of anticipatory resoluteness convey Heidegger's thought about the human condition.

One could object to Pattison, first of all, by stressing that anticipatory resoluteness gives possibility to existence: in opening Dasein to a possibility (death) that always remains outstanding so long as Dasein is, anticipatory resoluteness renders all that is actual not final or definitive. In this sense, anticipatory resoluteness means mutability and exposure to change; it does not mean constantly remaining the same, but openness – indeed, vulnerability to what always affects us, the world, overwhelming and altering us. If this is how authentic selfhood is realized, then far from offering the promise of disclosing the truth of our being permanently and as a whole, authentic existence entails the impossibility of Dasein picturing itself to itself in its entirety. Pattison, failing to grant this, interprets resoluteness as something like a strong-willed resolution, one made by a person of great enough willpower to keep it, a certain resolve that therefore produces a self-identical self. I, on the other hand, read it as something more like an openness that demands re-solving, repeatedly, the problems of an ever-new situation, again and again, each time. The whole that appears to resoluteness, Heidegger emphasizes, is a whole that can be and is always again taken back.[1] This makes Heidegger's concern for presenting Dasein as a whole something other, and less problematic, than Pattison contends it is.

Next, one could point out that Heidegger knows very well that authenticity unravels in time -- in fact, he makes such unraveling intrinsic to the being of Dasein when he shows how anticipatory resoluteness turns Dasein toward what turns it back to the inauthenticity of everyday absorbed concern. That is, the resoluteness that takes up existence authentically also takes up the possibility of the straying, falling, and inauthentic existence that flees the nothingness disclosed by resolute anticipation of death. Far from describing the extraction from or triumph over everyday concern, then, what Heidegger has described is something like the genesis of its characteristic traits and the inevitability of our fall into it. Dasein is not as heroic as Pattison contends, if it finds itself in its ever falling into inauthenticity when it turns toward being-in-the-world in authenticity.[2] Nor is it so triumphant, so capable of maintaining the willpower necessary to make the moment of decision a finally decisive moment of extraction from the failures associated with immersion in the everydayness of concern.[3] Anticipatory resoluteness concerns a specific way to take up this everydayness, not our extraction from it. This is why Heidegger insists, time and again, that authentic existence is a modification of everydayness, a different way to be in the everyday, not an escape or evasion of it.

Why then does Pattison think it necessary to turn from Heidegger to Kierkegaard's edifying discourses to conclude that "death's decisiveness is how it turns us around so as to see what is really decisive, namely, what we are doing in and with our lives" (89)? Does he think that Heidegger is talking only about death, that all Heidegger's talk about the resolute anticipation of death does not aim to uncover a possible way to be of existence? When Pattison claims that "anxiety in the face of death is a natural human response to ceasing to be, but the ethical and religious way of dealing with this anxiety is to turn away from the vision of death itself to what should be engaging us in our lives" (103), does he think resolute anticipation of death does not give Dasein a new way of life and that, if it does, this way of life does not include ethical engagement and love of others?

Yes, that is what he thinks, especially the last point: love and ethics are foreclosed by the resolute running ahead toward death in which Dasein realizes authentic selfhood. This point is argued throughout the book, but is the focus of chapters four and five. Most telling is a footnote in which Pattison rejects efforts made by Thomas Carlson to work out a thought of love in Heideggerian terms. Though recognizing that Carlson "attributes to Heidegger a view very similar to that which [Pattison himself develops] against Heidegger," Pattison objects that Heidegger's "work, especially Being and Time, [contains] elements that, so to speak, suppress it [viz. developing an account of authentic being with others in terms of love] at birth" (126). These elements are chiefly the privilege Heidegger grants running ahead toward death in determining authentic human existence: a self that realizes its authentic human existence in running ahead toward death is incapable of love, and it cannot be with others authentically because it cannot love. Repeating the solipsism of idealism's ego in existential terms, Dasein does not need others to realize authentic selfhood and is too consumed by its anticipation of death to have any time to give to others. In short, resolute running ahead toward death produces a "hyper-individualized anxiety" (125), caring too much for itself to care for others.

I have already indicated my own suspicion that resoluteness in Heidegger does not mean what Pattison makes it out to imply. This has important consequences for understanding the ethical possibilities of being-in-the-world. Sometimes, not always, Pattison's reading of anticipatory resoluteness makes it sound like something done to the exclusion of other dealings with which I might be concerned, as if I was busy obsessing about death and couldn't help others. But resolute anticipation of death is not something done to the exclusion of other concerned dealings of existence.[4] It is what lets Dasein take up authentically being-in-the-world, which includes as a structural item being-with-others. Authenticity, Heidegger insists, is not an extraction from the everyday, but a modification of it: it is a way to be in the everyday of existence, which includes publicness. More specifically, the issue is how to inhabit being-in-the-world and the everyday as something that matters, that is at-issue, that I care about, or else as something whose mattering is lost. With particular regard to being-with-others and publicness, then, the question posed by Heidegger is: How can my dealings with others be taken up authentically and in a way that these others matter?

To elaborate the possibility that Pattison says cannot be, a secular possibility of being-in-the-world, one would have to reconsider the sense of anticipatory resoluteness. This I take to be Carlson's project.[5] He asks: What would it mean for running ahead toward death to be the condition that opens the possibility of authentic being-with-others? Dasein's being-in-the-world, its secularity, Heidegger emphasizes again and again, includes being-with-others; the latter is a constitutive element of the former, separable for purposes of analysis, but not in reality. The issue is how to be in the world authentically such that the being-with-others constitutive of being-in-the-world also is authentic. Heidegger's point is that authentic being-with-others has to include an enactment of the distinction that differentiates self and other lest being-with be leveled down to indifference, rendering the other not different from myself, nor myself from her. The difference of separation is enacted in my resolute running ahead toward death, understood existentially as my own most nonsubstitutable possibility. In existing toward my death, I become an isolated individual, inhabiting being in such a way that it matters to me, and thereby able to be with the other authentically -- that is to say, without taking over her being or confusing mine with hers. This would be the beginning of the secular possibility of love. Pattison does not think such a possibility possible.

However one might take this review, I enjoyed Pattison's book and recommend reading it. Clearly written, well illustrated with abundant instances of literary figures that make the account poignant and salient, it should be read for the wealth of discussion it ought to provoke -- but discussion can be maintained only so long as we do not agree too quickly to the positions and interpretations of our interlocutors, or assume that their perspectives are our own. Philosophical discussion is the squabble of lovers, a squabble I have tried to keep open in pointing out the positions, interpretations, and perspectives that belong uniquely to the author of this fine book.

[1] "What then does the certainty which belongs to such resoluteness signify? Such certainty must maintain itself in what is disclosed by the resolution. But this means that it simply cannot become rigid as regards the Situation . . . The certainty of such resolution signifies that one holds oneself free forthe possibility of taking it back . . . [This] is authentic resoluteness which resolves to keep repeating itself" (Being and Time, 355).

[2] "Anticipatory resoluteness gives Dasein at the same time the primordial certainty that it has been closed off. In anticipatory resoluteness, Dasein holds itself open for its constant lostness in the irresoluteness of the 'they'" (Being and Time, 356).

[3] "In the moment of vision, indeed, and often just 'for that moment', existence can even gain mastery over the everyday; but it can never extinguish it" (Being and Time, 422).

[4] Translating vorlaufende Entschlossenheit as "resolutely running ahead (toward death)" contributes to the mistaken portrayal of Heideggerian philosophy as a philosophy of death, and of being-towards-death as a practice of life done alongside of, and therefore to the exclusion of, other practices and activities. A major problem with employing "resolutely running ahead towards death" is that the phrase makes active what I think is more passive. It achieves this sense by rendering the adjective vorlaufende as a nominal phrase, "running ahead", and the noun Entschlossenheit as an adjective or adverb. "Anticipatory resoluteness" makes more palpable the sense in which the activity at issue, if indeed it is an activity, is at best the act of patience or waiting. This becomes clear in Heidegger's later use of Entschlossenheit as nearly synonymous with Gelassenheit.

[5] See Thomas A. Carlson, "Notes on Love and Death in Augustine and Heidegger," Medieval Mystical Theology 21.1 (2012): 9-33. The possibility that a Heideggerian conception of authentic being-with-others founded on anticipatory resoluteness might be thought in terms of love is also explored by Christian Sommer in Heidegger, Aristote, Luther: Les sources aristtotéliciennes et néotestamentaires d'Etre et Temps (274ff).