Heidegger: The Introduction of Nazism into Philosophy in Light of the Unpublished Seminars of 1933-1935

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Emmanuel Faye, Heidegger: The Introduction of Nazism into Philosophy in Light of the Unpublished Seminars of 1933-1935, Michael B. Smith (tr.), Yale UP, 2009, 464pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780300120868.

Reviewed by Peter E. Gordon, Harvard University



“All things are wearisome; no man can speak of them all. Is not the eye surfeited with seeing, and the ear sated with hearing? What has happened will happen again, and what has been done will be done again, and there is nothing new under the sun.” Thus spake Koheleth, the Hebrew prophet. Of all writers in the Western tradition, Koheleth perhaps more than anyone else owes his singular fame to the fact that he was a man who was not impressed. What might have (and perhaps should have) roused him to moral fury, of the kind that consumed Isaiah and Amos and Jeremiah, prompted Koheleth only to compose a grandiloquent hymn to indifference. No frailty in human character surprised him. Our penchant for war and mendacity seemed in his eyes no more remarkable than the passing of the seasons. Curiosity itself left him cold. “For in much wisdom is much vexation,” he observed, “and he who increases knowledge, increases pain.”

And now, once again, Heidegger and Nazism: Once more the cycles of scandal and denunciation. Once again the shameful revelations and the no-less shameful attempts to conceal or prettify the ugly facts. The rituals of outrage are familiar, the dramatic end-of-innocence reports no less so. After reading Faye’s study, writes one critic, “it will be impossible to read Heidegger again naively.” But the age of naïveté is long since past. Who reads Heidegger naively? Haven’t we seen all of this before, and several times? Emmanuel Faye’s book makes its belated appearance in an academic culture that no doubt feels a certain exhaustion with the endless trials of l’affaire Heidegger. The ennui is perhaps justified. One might have thought, after all, that by this point just about everything that needed to be said had been said. But nobody, I think, has said it with quite as much historical evidence, nor with quite the same unrestrained vitriol, as Emmanuel Faye. His book, though it is hardly the only publication in recent years to revisit the matter of Heidegger’s politics, has already drawn the attention of the journalists and the journalistic academics for whom, it seems, philosophy merits discussion only when some outrage calls the very legitimacy of philosophy into question.1

When I undertook the task of reviewing this book, I did so with a sense of scholarly obligation, believing (as I sincerely do) that all scholarly arguments deserve a judicious assessment. I had not anticipated that the task of reading it would prove quite so unpleasant. No doubt a great deal of the unpleasantness is not Faye’s fault: to revisit the ugly business of Heidegger’s Nazism is hardly an occasion for joy. In fact, although it may come as a surprise that there was more to learn, Faye has unearthed long-neglected and previously unpublished documentation, further proof that Heidegger was a zealous rather than merely opportunistic supporter of the Third Reich. But Faye shares in the responsibility in that his tone is so immoderate and his general line of analysis so lacking in qualification. For this is surely one of the most single-minded and unrestrained political attacks on Heidegger’s philosophy ever written. Its genre is not that of a philosophical exposition but a jeremiad. The stance of prophetic outrage, however, is best left to the prophets. Towards the end of this review I shall try to explain in a more precise manner just what is so misguided in its approach, and just how its argument goes awry of its stated aims. But first, a summary is in order.

To understand this book, it may be helpful to recall that France has been the chief theater of ongoing controversy concerning the scandal of Heidegger’s politics.2 Beginning shortly after liberation with the publication of critical assessments by Karl Löwith, Maurice de Gandillac, and others in the pages of the newly-founded journal Les Temps Modernes, French intellectuals have returned again and again to the question of Heidegger and Nazism, and they have done so with a passion onlookers often find perplexing. That French intellectuals have not yet grown tired of the debate may say something about Heidegger’s prominence in the French philosophical canon. In its classic phase the controversy implicated Sartre as a philosopher whose own work made copious (if somewhat idiosyncratic) use of Heidegger’s existential motifs. The debate was never truly repressed but it returned nevertheless with the 1987 publication of a book by Victor Farias, Heidegger and Nazism, which set off a storm of salvos and counter-salvos by philosophers and social theorists such as Jacques Derrida, Pierre Bourdieu, and many others too numerous to mention. It may be of some interest to note that Emmanuel Faye’s own father, Jean-Pierre Faye, was a major player in an earlier phase of the Heidegger affair: In 1969, Faye (père) published a scathing attack on Derrida in the pages of the Communist paper L’Humanité, in which he accused Derrida and his colleagues on the journal Tel Quel of betraying the political cause by opening an ideological passage through history from the German right to the French left. Derrida, claimed Jean-Pierre Faye, was an agent of "le malheur Heideggerien."3 The elder Faye went on to write a book on Totalitarian Languages (1972) and another book addressing the whole phenomenon of Heidegger’s philosophy, entitled The Trap: Heideggerian Philosophy and National Socialism (1992).

The apple has not fallen far from the tree. But Faye fils has enjoyed a distinguished career of his own. Emmanuel Faye is an associate professor of philosophy at the University de Paris X, Nanterre, who has written primarily on Descartes and other philosophers in the broad tradition of Renaissance and early-modern humanism, such as Montaigne, Pascal, and Bovelle: His first book, Philosophie et perfection de l’homme. De la Renaissance à Descartes, was published by J. Vrin in 1998. Now, Faye clearly believes that these are thinkers who helped to lay the foundations for all that is noble in European culture. In his eyes Descartes in particular would seem to mark the beginnings of a philosophical-political canon that extols the primacy of the autonomous individual, over and against all theories of thoroughgoing social or historical determination. On Faye’s view, this individualist groundwork has an unquestionable appeal, and he therefore finds it especially irksome that Heidegger’s critique of the Cartesian ego has gained such widespread acceptance in European philosophical discussion. He does not pause to consider the fact that well before Heidegger came on the scene the philosophical tradition had already seen a great many challenges to the Cartesian ego, none of which immediately devolved into apologies for National Socialism. One could argue that even Montaigne’s Essais (especially the essay “Of Experience” and the “Apology for Raymond Sebond”) articulate the beginnings of a now-familiar complaint against the certitudes of metaphysical individualism. But Faye does not stop to defend the apparently unquestionable premises of his own political philosophy. Instead he plunges into Being and Time, to which he devotes a section approximately three pages in length. His ambition in this section is to show that Heidegger, by means of a “destruction of the individual,” was making room for “the communal destiny of the people,” a task which was (writes Faye) “in neither intent nor approach a purely philosophical undertaking,” but was in fact a “political project,” the ground-laying for an anti-individualistic ideology that lay “embedded in the very foundations of National Socialism” (17-18).

Now, it should be noted that the status of the individual subject or “ego” in Being and Time is a philosophical problem of major proportions. As is well known, Heidegger commences with the Husserlian-phenomenological presupposition that experience is in each case “mine” only to discover that this “mineness” or Jemeinigkeit cannot be recovered without reference to a mode of being-in-the-world that is incorrigibly social and historical. But if the transcendental ego seems to dissolve into its own constitutive worldhood, Heidegger spends much of the second division of Being and Time attempting to show how each one of us can nonetheless arrive at our “ownmost” understanding of who we are. This derivation of “authentic” selfhood “modifies” without entirely undoing the “inauthenticity” that marks the very core of our existence. The drama of this double-movement has attracted considerable attention from philosophers of radically divergent philosophical persuasions, such as David Farrell Krell, Michael Zimmerman, Françoise Dastur, and Taylor Carman, to name just a few. But none of them would say that Heidegger was simply bent upon the wholesale “destruction” of the individual. At the very least, Faye’s interpretation seems highly controversial, and it would surely demand more than three pages to establish its legitimacy. More importantly, I do not know of anyone besides Faye himself who is so ready to see in this so-called “destruction” of the individual a “political project” that anticipated and helped to prepare the way for the Third Reich’s propagandistic language of national solidarity. To be sure, one might argue that there are certain affinities or rhetorical resemblances that could partially implicate Heidegger’s anti-Cartesianism in the Nazi celebration of collective belonging. To construct an argument in this fashion, however, one would need to explain just how a totalitarian politics of national belonging could also make room for Heidegger’s disparaging talk about public “leveling” and “ambiguity” — talk that seems to betray the philosopher’s enormous dislike for the way modern society flattens out crucial features of individual experience. One could develop arguments to explain such apparent incongruities, but Faye himself makes no effort to do so. Nor does he permit himself a moment’s pause to consider the possibility that Being and Time might bear different sorts of meanings for different readers and at different points in time. Instead he simply insists that Heidegger’s anti-Cartesianism (apparently, the only significant philosophical doctrine in Being and Time) just is nothing else but a political-ideological preparation for Nazism.

This is the first chapter of the book. Unfortunately, it is by far the weakest. But it is followed by nearly eight chapters of textual exposition in which Faye lays before us a great variety of pro-Nazi texts by Heidegger. Most of these are from speeches and seminars the philosopher delivered during 1933-34, the period of his tenure as rector at Freiburg University. Some of these speeches are well known; others remain unpublished. It is important to note that with this documentation Faye has put to rest any remaining questions about the extent of Heidegger’s political involvement with National Socialism. The cumulative effect of reading through all of this material (from which Faye quotes at great length) confirms one thing beyond any doubt: Heidegger was deeply convinced, politically and philosophically, that the founding of the Third Reich heralded a glorious future for Germany. What this evidence does not prove, however, is that “Heideggerian philosophy” is somehow nothing more than an ideological smokescreen for Nazism. This is a crucial distinction, but it is one Faye refuses to consider. I will say something more about this issue later on. But first we must confront the facts squarely in the face.

In the winter semester of 1933-34, during his period of academic tenure as rector, Heidegger taught a seminar entitled On the Essence and Concepts of Nature, History, and State. The seminar does not as yet appear in Heidegger’s collected works, and, according to Faye, there are no current plans to include it in the collected works in the future. This is perhaps unsurprising, since the contents of this seminar are nothing less than grotesque. At one point Heidegger justifies the Nazi ideal of Lebensraum but observes that the concept is only intelligible to those who belong to the German nation: “The nature of our German space would surely be apparent to a Slavic people in a different manner than to us,” Heidegger notes; “to a Semitic nomad, it may never be apparent” (Quoted in Faye, 144). Lest there be any lingering doubt as how Heidegger feels about these “Semitic nomads,” he tells his students the following:

History teaches us that the nomads did not become what they are because of the bleakness of the desert and the steppes, but that they have even left numerous wastelands behind them that had been fertile and cultivated land when they arrived, and that men rooted in the soil have been able to create for themselves in a native land, even in the wilderness. (Quoted in Faye, 143)

Alongside this sort of speculative racial typology, pitting the nomad against those who are “rooted” in the soil, Heidegger also takes the time to justify the philosophical foundations of the Führerprinzip:

Only where leader and led together bind each other in one destiny, and fight for the realization of one idea, does true order grow. Then spiritual superiority and freedom respond in the form of deep dedication of all powers to the people, to the state, in the form of the most rigid training, as commitment, resistance, solitude, and love. Then the existence and the superiority of the Führer sink down into being, into the soul of the people and thus bind it authentically and passionately to the task. And when the people feel this dedication, they will let themselves be led into struggle, and they will want and love the struggle. They will develop and persist in their strength, be true and sacrifice themselves. With each new moment the Führer and the people will be bound more closely, in order to realize the essence of their state, that is their Being; growing together, they will oppose the two threatening forces, death and the devil, that is, impermanence and the falling away from one’s own essence, with their meaningful, historical Being and Will. (Quoted in Faye, 140)

Such passages are dismaying, to say the least. And there is enough of it for Faye to fill many chapters. Unfortunately, Faye interlaces the most damning evidence with far less convincing documentation concerning Heidegger’s contemporaries, not infrequently indulging in an easily refuted strategy of guilt-by-association. Concerning the passage above, for example, Faye reminds us that in Hitler’s Mein Kampf the devil is explicitly identified with the Jew. Heidegger’s listeners, writes Faye, “could scarcely be unaware” of this fact. For Faye it therefore follows that “In orchestrating the pathos of the devil in reference to the Führer, Heidegger awakens and cultivates the darkest side of Hitlerism in his students” (140).

This is not only unconvincing, it is altogether unnecessary. There is sufficient direct evidence of Heidegger’s anti-Semitism that Faye should have avoided argumentation of this sort. His indictment would have been far stronger. Instead Faye indulges in a great deal of associative recrimination: What Faye calls Heidegger’s “anti-Cartesian diatribe” in a course from May, 1933 turns out to be "the position that will be that of the most radical Nazis throughout the 1930s, culminating in 1938 in Franz Böhm’s Anti-Cartesianismus" (93). We are also told that Heidegger cultivated a “close and privileged relationship” with the young historian Rudolf Stadelmann, who in 1933 was an instructor at Freiburg and a member of the SA. If this relationship alone were not sufficient, Faye also quotes a public speech Stadelmann gave on November 9, 1933 (the tenth anniversary of the demonstration in front of the Munich Feldherrnhalle), a speech in which Stadelmann first extols Hegel as a “brilliant thinker of the German race” and goes on to name the Nazi philosopher Ernst Krieck as a key theorist of the “German spirit.” Faye then reminds us that “At this date, Krieck is still Heidegger’s ally” (127). What further lesson does Faye believe we have learned by tracing out these lines of affiliation? Heidegger associated with Stadelmann, and Stadelmann invokes Krieck, and, ergo, Heidegger was a Nazi. But we knew this already.

The evidence of Heidegger’s Nazi-commitments is incontrovertible. Faye pays particular attention to the winter course from 1933-34, The Essence of Truth, where Heidegger entertains the meaning of the term “enemy” as follows:

The enemy is one who poses an essential threat to the existence of the people and its members. The enemy is not necessarily the outside enemy, and the outside enemy is not necessarily the most dangerous. It may even appear that there is no enemy at all. The root requirement is then to find the enemy, to bring him to light or even to create him, in order that there may be that standing up to the enemy, and that existence not become apathetic. The enemy may have grafted himself onto the innermost root of the existence of a people, and oppose the latter’s ownmost essence, acting contrary to it. All the keener and harsher and more difficult then is the struggle, for only a very small part of the struggle consists in mutual blows; it is often much harder and more exhausting to seek out the enemy as such, and to lead him to reveal himself, to avoid nurturing illusions about him, to remain ready to attack, to cultivate and increase constant preparedness and to initiate the attack on a long-term basis, with the goal of total extermination. (Quoted in Faye, 168)

Faye is quite right to say that the above is “one of the most indefensible pages of Heidegger.” But Faye goes further. Invoking Hitler’s speech of 30 January, 1939, in which Hitler warned that world war would mean “the extermination of the Jewish race in Europe,” Faye notes that, "this is quite simply the ultimate translation into action of what Heidegger theorizes in 1933" (171, my emphasis). Faye explains: "It is important that we realize that the doctrine of the enemy … , however “ontologized” it may be by Heidegger, is in no form or fashion a simple theoretical view or intellectual game but indeed a radically murderous doctrine, the translation of which into the real world cannot but lead to the war of extermination and the concentration camps" (170, my emphasis).

On Faye’s view, therefore, Heidegger furnished the theory which necessarily reached its ultimate realization in the Holocaust. (I have italicized the language of necessary entailment, above.) Now, it would be tempting to imagine that Faye does not mean to take it this far. But we must resist qualifying his argument for him. On the contrary, in what are perhaps the most shocking passages in the book Faye implies that Heidegger may have been a secret speech-writer for Hitler. After all, Faye observes, we know that Hitler did not write all of his own speeches. And we also know that Heidegger nourished the ambition “to lead the Führer” (den Führer führen). We know, furthermore, that Heidegger was “close to Goebbels’s circle” and that he even spoke on one occasion of “Hitler’s admirable hands.” Finally, the most damning evidence is that, while “we do not know precisely what Heidegger’s activities were from July 1932 to April 1933,” there is at least one speech by Hitler from December 1932 which is “in conception, terminology, and style, particularly close to Heidegger’s proposals found in his speeches and seminars of 1933-1934.” It is therefore possible — Faye calls this a “hypothesis” — that Heidegger wrote at least one of Hitler’s speeches (148-49).

What does Faye want us to conclude from all of this evidence? He wants us to conclude that Heidegger’s philosophy itself is nothing more than Nazi ideology. He suggests, for example, that the Gesamtausgabe (the official edition of Heidegger’s complete works) should be regarded as nothing more than a compendium of Nazi ideology. “By its very content,” Faye writes, “it disseminates within philosophy the explicit and remorseless legitimation of the guiding principles of the Nazi movement” (246). In fact, according to Faye, “It is impossible to go further in the negation of the human being than Heidegger does” (306). But ultimately this means that Faye no longer finds it acceptable that we should call Heidegger a philosopher: “The monstrousness of what Heidegger says places him outside all philosophy” (305). But if his writings were not philosophy, then what were they? “With the work of Heidegger,” Faye writes, “it is the principles of Hitlerism and Nazism that have been introduced into the philosophy libraries of the planet.” It follows that Heidegger’s works should be reclassified:

In order to preserve the future of philosophical thought, it is equally indispensable for us to inquire into the true nature of Heidegger’s Gesamtausgabe, a collection of texts containing principles that are racist, eugenic, and radically deleterious to the existence of human reason. Such a work cannot continue to be placed in the philosophy section of libraries; its place is rather in the historical archives of Nazism and Hitlerism (319).

Apparently Faye is serious about this. It is therefore crucial to explain just why this proposal is mistaken and why its premises are so contrary to the very spirit of philosophy that Faye says he wants to defend.

Let us imagine a page on which we will trace out a spectrum of possible readings. On the left-most side of the page are those interpretations of Heidegger’s philosophy that reject any possible connection with Nazism. On the right-most side of the page are those interpretations of Heidegger’s philosophy that assert a complete identity between his philosophy and Nazi ideology. Between these two extremes we could differentiate the whole variety of distinctive claims that have been proposed over the years by a great many scholars, most of them no doubt sincere and dedicated to philosophy, all of them (we presume) troubled by the basic and undeniable facts concerning Heidegger’s political choices during the 1930s. Some assert that although it is clear that Heidegger was personally attracted to Nazism, his personal commitments do not contaminate his properly philosophical views. Others claim that Heidegger’s radical-right political attitudes are littered throughout his corpus, but we can subject those attitudes to criticism and thereby redeem certain other, occasional insights that may still hold philosophical significance.

On this spectrum Faye’s book argues for the most extreme thesis in the right-most column. In fact, it would be difficult to imagine a thesis more extreme than his. For it is Faye’s express claim that all of Heidegger’s philosophy is nothing more than the theory for which Nazism is the realization. The problem is that Faye’s argument never manages to ward off the most obvious objection.

The objection runs as follows. Any genuinely philosophical texts are open rather than closed in their interpretative possibilities. This is what keeps philosophy alive. It is what makes philosophy an exercise in thinking rather than an exercise in the thoughtless reproduction of what has already been thought before. Now, there have been hundreds of books and essays by very intelligent people who have striven in vigorous conversation to make sense of Heidegger’s works, exploring their potentialities, expanding upon certain insights while modifying or dispensing with others. The history of philosophy is just this: an ongoing conversation stretching into the future, a chain of interpretation, argumentation, and counter-argumentation that addresses itself to a contested and always contestable canon of works. This is what I mean when I say that philosophical texts are “open” rather than “closed.” One may begin from some specific body of texts written by a particular author who wrote at some precise moment in the past. But in reading that body of texts one develops new thoughts that the original author may never have intended and may, indeed, have vigorously disputed. Historical reconstruction may very well help us to understand what a given text may have meant at a particular moment in time — to its author, and to any number of the author’s immediate contemporaries. Even then, however, we are liable to stumble upon historical debates at the very birth of a philosophical text, defeating our hope of ever arriving at some unitary and fixed text-in-itself. To this one might add more complicated problems, such as the “polysemy” of every text and the unconscious or latent meanings that afflict standard notions of authorial intent. Similar worries would also call into question the notion of a single or unitary historical context. For any given text, there is not just one but multiple contexts in which that text might be understood. And no one of those contexts deserves to stand alone as the ultimate horizon for our interpretation. One can sift through Heidegger’s philosophical arguments for their political significance, but the political context is only one dimension among many. Those arguments also address themselves to long-standing debates concerning, say, the phenomenology of religion, or the intentional structure of human action. Surely these contexts, too, deserve our attention. We should be wary of any scholar who would have us believe there is only one dimension to the world.

The historical reconstruction of a philosophical text can do many things. It can enable as well as disable. It can help us to appreciate further the multidimensionality of contexts and the polyvalence of textual meanings. It can alert us to hidden complicities and unexplored possibilities. It can even compel us to confront the way that philosophical meanings are determined and over-determined by the basest of motives. What it cannot do is shut down the business of further reading. For the fact is that we are always reading, and nobody can tell us our readings are incorrect simply because the original author might have objected to them. It is indeed crucial to the survival of philosophy as an interpretative activity that we always leave ourselves open to the thought that past authors might have been mistaken. To reject this thought is to succumb to the worst sort of interpretative authoritarianism. It seems clear that Heidegger used his own philosophy to motivate all sorts of terrible political conclusions. And we would be right to condemn him for this. But we have the freedom to dispute his readings. He may have been the first arbiter of what he meant. But that does not mean he was the best. No matter how abominable his politics, no matter how horribly he compromised his philosophy by interweaving it with brutal apologies for fascism, today his writings remain available to us. We should indeed take comfort in the fact that we are free to read them in new ways.

The most dismaying thing about Faye’s book is that, apparently, he wants to deny us this freedom. He believes that Heidegger’s texts just aren’t available for transformative interpretation. To be sure, the fact that there is a vast body of scholarship on Heidegger written by a great many very thoughtful people would seem to disprove that belief. But Faye has the temerity to imply that this entire literature is simply in error, because on his view there just isn’t anything philosophical in Heidegger’s corpus that would make itself available for interpretation. Could Faye be right and everyone else mistaken? This seems unlikely. The more likely explanation is that Faye has permitted himself to be carried away by his outrage. I would not wish to conclude this review without noting that I believe his motives are in many respects noble. Like any good prophet, he wishes to turn us from evil and toward the narrow path of righteousness. His tone is intemperate (indeed, at times, it is nearly insufferable). But one cannot blame him for wishing to warn us once again of the political dangers that may await us in the philosophical tradition. We have heard this warning before, and we should not grow so indifferent that we cannot hear it again. What is most objectionable in Faye’s book, however, is his astonishing belief that he can save us from these dangers only if he stops the conversation cold.

1 See, e.g., Carlin Romano, “Heil Heidegger!” The Chronicle of Higher Education (18 October, 2009); also see Patricia Cohen, “An Ethical Question: Does a Nazi Deserve a Place Among Philosophers?” The New York Times (8 November, 2009).

2 For the political and philosophical context of the Heidegger reception in France, see Tom Rockmore, Heidegger and French Philosophy: Humanism, Anti-Humanism, and Being (Routledge, 1995) and Ethan Kleinberg, Generation Existential: Heidegger’s Philosophy in France, 1927-1961 (Cornell, 2005).

3 For a summary of Jean-Pierre Faye’s role in this scandal, see Peter Eli Gordon, “Hammer without a Master: French Phenomenology and the Origins of Deconstruction (or, How Derrida read Heidegger)” in Histories of Postmodernism. Mark Bevir, Jill Hargis and Sara Rushing, eds. (Routledge, 2007), 103-130