Heidegger's Shadow: Kant, Husserl and the Transcendental Turn

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Chad Engelland, Heidegger's Shadow: Kant, Husserl and the Transcendental Turn, Routledge, 2017, xiv + 275pp., $140 (hbk), ISBN 9781138181878.

Reviewed by Sacha Golob, King's College London


One way to understand the trajectory of Heidegger's thought is as a series of engagements with the possibilities and the risks inherent in transcendental philosophy. This approach is the basis of Engelland's book; as he elegantly puts it, the transcendental functions throughout Heidegger's career as the 'shadow' which he cannot jump over, the hermeneutic situation out of which he writes (p.206). Heidegger's attitude to the transcendental evidently undergoes complex shifts, shifts mediated in part by his successive dialogues with Husserl, Kant, and others, but Engelland's central argument is that this attitude is never purely negative: as he sees it, even the later Heidegger offers what is effectively a 'transcendental critique of transcendence' (p.172). In this, the text challenges the oft repeated view that the post-Kehre Heidegger rejects transcendental thinking. Authors such as Crowell and Malpas have recognized the inadequacy of that standard narrative, but, as they themselves admitted, were far from clear on how exactly an alternative reconstruction should proceed:

while the idea of the transcendental is explicitly disavowed in Heidegger's later thought, there still seems to be an important sense (thought one that remains in need of clarification) in which that thinking retains a broadly 'transcedental' character.[1]

What Engelland effectively offers is the much needed clarification, exegetically and philosophically, of that 'important sense'.

Engelland begins from Husserl and a natural way of thinking about the interaction between phenomenology and transcendental philosophy. As he puts it:

The transcendental turn of phenomenology takes the world as given and inquires into the how of the giving, the manner of its givenness, the how of its acquisition of meaning. (p.13, original emphases)

On Engelland's account Heidegger's achievement, progressing through Sein und Zeit (SZ) into the Kehre and beyond, is to gradually reformulate, deepen and ultimately revolutionize this research programme. SZ takes the first step, by offering a detailed analysis of what Engelland calls 'the preparatory question', the question of the nature of Dasein and of the way in which Dasein is able to 'transcend', to encounter entities (pp.35-6). But SZ itself already points beyond this framework in its appeal to temporality: after all, 'Transcendence enables us to encounter entities, but what enables transcendence?' (p.36). For Engelland, this foreshadows an ongoing shift as Heidegger attempts to provide a progressively deeper analysis of what he comes to call 'the open', the basic fact of presencing. As the text puts it in a helpful comparison with Marion:

The difference is that what Heidegger finds thought-provoking about the transcendental turn is not so much the theme of givenness as the emergence of the domain of givenness. Hence, his radicalization of the transcendental brings out the experience of the domain. (p.221)[2]


At play in all [Heidegger's] writings is the continuous radicalization of the transcendental turn, the continuous attempt to speak of that which necessarily withdraws in making every experience possible. (p.229)

The ultimate target of the analysis is thus both a necessary condition on experience and that which resists itself being experienced, at least in any straightforward sense. As has been widely noted, Heidegger has many names for this: 'In the Contributions, he calls this relation itself the 'between' or 'appropriation' (Ereignis) (p.177).

Leaving aside a few presentational issues -- chapter one alone features 'cardinal', 'grounding' 'guiding', 'preliminary', 'preparatory,' 'leading' and 'fundamental' questions, where some of these distinctions map Heidegger's usage, some highlight points Engelland is making but which Heidegger did not always see clearly, and some are mere stylistic variants -- this yields a clear, over-arching analysis of both SZ and of its placement within Heidegger's larger work. For Engelland, SZ's limitations stem from

the suggestion that a prior subject subsequently transcends entities, a movement that overlooks what is in fact more fundamental: the openness of the domain in which such transcendence is possible in the first place. In other words, Heidegger gives a transcendental critique of transcendence . . . Before Dasein can be in a position to go beyond entities, Dasein must in the first place be brought into the open domain in some manner or another. (p.172)

With these initial remarks in place, I want now to bring out some of the core moves within Engelland's account.

First, Heidegger's later work remains transcendental in a very strong sense: as Engelland sees it, not only is later Heidegger engaged in an inquiry concerning the ultimate conditions of experience, that project is intelligible only if approached via the familiar transcendental framework offered in SZ, a story focused around a privileged subject-like entity. The result is that, as Heidegger himself poetically puts it, the early work is the step back necessary before the leap of the later writings (Ga65, p.305). This creates an enormously complex hermeneutic and pedagogical situation: Heidegger must 'either affirm transcendental philosophy and thereby distort his goal' -- since transcendental philosophy as standardly understood fails to push to the deeper level of questioning demanded -- or deny it 'and thereby occlude his point of departure' (p.208). It is important to stress just how deep this tension runs. After all, a natural question, and one I will return to, is how much sense we can really make of ever deeper questions about givenness and the space in which it occurs. The initial Kantian move is simple enough: the transcendental does not address facts or entities, but rather the conditions under which I can be aware of something as a fact or under which I can intend an entity. But what exactly is the deeper question of 'the emergence of the domain of givenness' (p.221)? It is often observed that many of Heidegger's later formulations sound almost mystical. Indeed:

it remains questionable whether even the best of his later terminology (e.g., 'the clearing') would be understandable unless it were first translated back into the phenomenological transcendentalese of Being and Time (ecstatic horizon of timeliness) before making the appropriate corrective adjustments. (pp.239-40)

So SZ is not only exegetically necessary for understanding the development of Heidegger's thought, it remains conceptually necessary if we are to pose the deeper question that moves beyond it.

Second, Engelland argues that the Beiträge develops a sophisticated 'affective transcendentalism' (p.172, pp.183-84). The idea is that particular dispositions conceal or attune us to the deeper issue Heidegger is seeking to raise. So, for example, wonder is problematic because it leads to an over-focus on entities:

In the experience of wonder, a Plato or Aristotle attended to present entities, thereby neglecting the experience of presence itself. (p.240)

Heidegger thus seeks to identify an alternate set of dispositions, for example Verhaltenheit ('reservedness'), which prepare us to attend to what has been overlooked (pp.191-94):

In contrast to wonder's tragic shortcoming, the fundamental disposition of reservedness heeds the necessary withdrawal of the context of being that enables the presence of entities. (p.184)

Engelland's discussion of affectivity in this period is highly sophisticated; I learnt a great deal from it, as I am sure others will too. But it also raises some complex methodological questions, in particular how hard one should press Heidegger to cash his position in more neutral terms. For example, it is clear that the story about affectivity is meant to help us understand the deeper openness, the 'deeper relation . . . to the us-thing between' (p.177) which traditional philosophy has allegedly overlooked. Engelland juxtaposes this affective approach with what Heidegger often calls a 'representational' one: 'Heidegger disavows the representation of transcendence as a going beyond, but . . . not . . . the opening up of the transcendental domain disclosed in Being and Time' (p.174).

One response would be to challenge Heidegger here: what exactly is this deeper sense of openness that the tradition has missed? Is it an openness prior to judgement, or to perception, or to both? Why, especially if it is somehow non-conceptual, is it not sharable with non-human animals? Similarly, what precisely are 'representational' accounts -- after all, the term is one of the most ambiguous in the history of philosophy, and it is hard to avoid the suspicion that it often plays a more rhetorical than substantive role in Heidegger's discussion. Is Kant a representationalist? Husserl? Was SZ representationalist? If so, what is the commitment they all share? In line with his aim, which is effectively to offer a critical but internal reconstruction, to 'understand Heidegger . . . as he understood himself when he was most self-aware and self-critical' (p.8), Engelland does not press Heidegger in this way, but his account does help us see where pressure might be applied.

Third, Engelland construes Heidegger as, in a very significant sense, a purely theoretical thinker.

Kant remains something more than a merely transcendental thinker; he is in touch with the Socratic heritage of philosophy. Heidegger remains merely a transcendental thinker . . . He was not . . . a philosopher in the sense of a Socrates, a Kant or Levinas, that is, a thinker for whom the question of the examined life was paramount. (p.234)

Instead, he pursued, with single-minded focus, 'his theoretical question concerning our experience of experience' (p.233). By extension, his anti-Semitism has no more significance for his work than it would in the case of the anti-Semitic mathematician (p.232). In a sense, I agree with Engelland that his work is problematically theoretical, but I think the problem was not so much that he focused on a single question, but rather that he had a deeply limited axiology, one dominated by ontology.[3]

I want to close by discussing two topics; one concerns a worry internal to the book's intellectual context, the other a possible line of development.

The worry relates to the treatment of Kant. Heidegger's Kant exegesis is notoriously difficult to make sense of, yet it is obviously crucial if we are to understand this book's topic. Engelland provides an elegant overview of the main developments in Heidegger's attitude to Kant (see, for example, p.70). But his account faces some serious problems. On the one hand, much of what Engelland says fails to separate Heidegger's reading from the textbook view of the first Critique. For example, whilst it is obviously right that Heidegger sees the dependence of thought on intuition as marking a break with Leibnizian rationalism, this is a point on which orthodox Kantians will happily agree (pp.81-2, p.209). For this reason, it seems a mistake to treat Leibniz as 'the key' to understanding Heidegger's Kant; this approach systematically obscures what Heidegger is doing that standard Kantians are not (p.85). On the other hand, Engelland's analysis of the distinctively Heideggerian aspects of the Kant book is not convincing. For example, Heidegger claims that primordial time, which is itself equated with transcendental imagination, constitutes the deep unity of the Kantian subject: thus the primordial future supposedly makes possible the synthesis of recognition in a concept (Ga3, p.186).

These are puzzling claims and have been widely mocked by Kantians. One worry, as Henrich alleged, is that Heidegger has simply slid from the textbook point that imagination is one faculty mediating between others to the extravagant claim that it is somehow the basis for those others.[4] The appeal to primordial time does not obviously fare much better: conceptual synthesis seems neither necessary nor sufficient for some kind of future orientation (consider <yesterday> or the future orientated behaviour of squirrels burying nuts).[5] Of course, Heidegger might respond that by 'future' here he means something much richer -- some complex web of claims about the for-the-sake-of-which and so on. But that then risks begging the question against Kant, who will simply reply that this level of self-understanding assumes, rather than enables, conceptual awareness. In sum, these are all puzzling claims -- and yet, surely, we need to make some sense of them if we are to reconstruct what was going through Heidegger's head in this first, most sustained, engagement with the transcendental. My concern is that Engelland does not offer much in the way of support for them (pp.101-02). There is also little direct analysis of the Schematism, which Heidegger insists is the key to his relationship with Kant (Ga21, pp.357-58). Perhaps this is simply a discrete silence because the claims cannot be made good -- my own view is that the reality is much more complex[6] -- but it would have been helpful to have a closer discussion of them given the importance of Kant for any treatment of the transcendental and for Heidegger especially.

This brings me to the possible line of development: it concerns the relationship between the transcendental, transcendental arguments and transcendental idealism. The standard reading of Kant embeds the transcendental within what Cassam calls a 'world-directed argument': crudely, the move is from facts about the conditions of experience to the attribution of contested properties to objects in the world.[7] This is the standard reading partly because it positions Kant neatly in relation to Hume: the properties whose attribution is so licensed are those Hume called into question. But there is another way to see things: one can also offer what Cassam calls 'self-directed transcendental arguments'. On this picture, one regresses from certain assumed facts about objects in the world to certain contested claims about the conditions which make experience of such objects possible. The two approaches obviously differ radically: indeed, the conclusion of the first class of argument may well be the premise of the second. Furthermore, the two approaches vary deeply with respect to the question of idealism. There is after all, a very widespread assumption that transcendental arguments require transcendental idealism. On the first approach, this is readily explicable: without it, it seems that we can establish nothing more than 'this is how we have to see must see the world'; we cannot make the final step to 'this is how the world must be'.[8] On the second approach, however, there is no such obvious move.

My own opinion is that Heidegger was highly unusual in always assuming a self-directed model of the transcendental, including in his work on Kant, and that this explains both his complex handling of critical terminology such as 'a priori' and the fact that he was himself a realist.[9] These claims are of course controversial. So one interesting way to develop Engelland's work would be to explore how a broader study of transcendental arguments might shed light on Heidegger's position. Another would be to look much more directly at the issue of idealism. The links between transcendental thought and idealism has been central to the debates surrounding Husserl and to earlier treatments of Heidegger on these themes (for example, Blattner's ground-breaking Heidegger's Temporal Idealism.) Engelland himself presents Heidegger as a realist, a point on which I agree, but the substantive discussion is extremely brief, a few pages only (pp.224-27).

I have attempted to highlight here a few points where I either disagree with Engelland or where I would like to hear more. Such disputes are, of course, inevitable with a thinker as complex and important as Heidegger. This is a subtle and engaging work, underwritten by a deep knowledge of Heidegger's texts: it does much to advance our understanding of Heidegger's complex, conflicted, relationship with the transcendental and it deserves the closest of attention.


References are to the Gesamtausgabe edition (Frankfurt: Klostermann, 1975-), abbreviated as Ga).

Ga3 - Kant und das Problem der Metaphysik (1998)

Ga21 - Logik: Die Frage nach der Wahrheit (1976)

Ga65 - Beiträge zur Philosophie (Vom Ereignis) (1989)


Blattner, W. (1999). Heidegger's Temporal Idealism. Cambridge University Press.

Cassam, Q. (1999). 'Self-Directed Transcendental Arguments', in Stern, R. (ed.) Transcendental Arguments. Oxford University Press.

Crowell, S. and Malpas, J. (eds.) (2007). Transcendental Heidegger. Stanford University Press.

Golob, S. (Forthcoming). 'Heidegger and The Occlusion of the Political' in Geschichte, Politik, Ideologie. Heideggers, Schwarze Hefte' im Kontext, Espinet, Figal, Keiling and Mirkovic (eds.). Mohr Siebeck, pp.1-20.

Golob, S. (2013). 'Heidegger on Kant, Time, and the "Form" of Intentionality', British Journal for the History of Philosophy, Vol.21, pp.345–67.

Henrich, D. (1994). The Unity of Reason. Harvard University Press.

[1] Crowell and Malpas (eds.) 2007, p.1.

[2] Compare: 'Throughout the 1930s and later, Heidegger's thought remains concerned preliminarily with the 'to be' of the dative for the givenness of entities, and primarily with the opening up of the domain in which we can be the dative of being' (p.58).

[3] I develop this proposal in relation to the Schwarze Hefte in particular in Golob Forthcoming.

[4] Henrich 1994, p.34, p.50.

[5] Animal behaviour is surely non-conceptual for both Kant and Heidegger if anything is.

[6] For my own views on Heidegger's Kant, see Golob 2013.

[7] Cassam 1999, p.85.

[8] I am grossly over-simplifying here; but I think this crude story is still helpful for seeing the dialectic in play.

[9] For discussion, see Golob 2013.