Heine and Critical Theory

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Willi Goetschel, Heine and Critical Theory, Bloomsbury, 2019, 311pp., $114.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781350087293.

Reviewed by Anthony Phelan, University of Oxford


Heinrich Heine, German Jewish poet and essayist, has figured significantly in Willi Goetschel's work on what he has called 'the invention of modern Jewish thought', as the writer who mediated and in some measure liberated the critical force of Spinoza's thought. In resourcing a critique of Hegel from Spinoza, Heine appears as the thinker who was able to disturb an assimilationist settlement of the 'Jewish problem' in German culture. In this new book, Goetschel returns to Heine in the philosophical contexts he has considered before; the comic turns and ironic performances of Heine's Pictures of Travel, in particular, but also of his History of Religion and Philosophy in Germany and the studied frivolities of his memoir of Ludwig Börne, are drawn into an exposition that suggests ways in which Heine allows for and makes sense of significant later figures in a critical tradition -- first Marx and Nietzsche, then Freud, Adorno, Horkheimer, Walter Benjamin, Fromm and Marcuse, and even Foucault and Derrida. Throughout, Heine's engagement with Spinoza provides the critical impulse for an historical elucidation of these varied critics and thinkers.

Goetschel acknowledges that his book attempts 'to read what was never written' (alarmingly attributed to Hugo von Hoffmannsthal with a double f -- an author who never wrote . . . ). In practice this means that the argument works in two ways: Goetschel seeks Heine's filiations in the work of these German critical thinkers, but also seeks out in Heine the philosophical work implied by or undertaken in texts that seem harmlessly comic. The investigation shuttles back and forth, in pursuit of the claim that 'Critical Theory equals Heine without the humor' (p. x), while Adorno's negative dialectics stand in for Critical Theory to 'help track the critical thrust in Heine'. In all of these endeavors, Goetschel foregrounds Heine's assertion of Jewish difference as a counter-move both to the supersessionism that Goetschel finds everywhere in (what he takes to be) Christian theology, equated with non-Jewish German society, and to the suppression of Jewish sources for the intellectual development of the Frankfurt School. This expository plan locates Heine, as heir to Goethe, at the productive point of difference between 'the German and the Jewish cultural, literary and intellectual traditions' (p. 7). It also puts a lot of pressure on the 'and' of Goetschel's title.

The forms taken by this conjunction of Heine and later writers is variable: Benjamin's 'On the Concept of History' (cited here as the 'Theses on History') and 'much of the Arcades Project read like a gloss on Heine's critical engagement with the challenge of rethinking time and temporality in the face of modernity' (p. 22); when it comes to Marx, Nietzsche, and Freud, the 'and' means 'tracing resonances' (p. 49); Marx's style 'took its cue' from Heine; Heine's critical insights 'recur' or 'resurface' in Marx; aspects of Heine 'anticipate' (p. 63) or 'prelude' (p. 89) or 'foreshadow' (p. 83) elements of critique in Marx and the rest; Nietzsche 'takes a hint from and emulates' Heine in a 'deeper family resemblance' (p. 78). Or 'Heine appears as the underlying subtext' (p. 78); he may prove 'paradigmatic' or 'exemplify' subsequent theory.

Though this range of terms feels like an expository vulnerability, the early chapters of the book could be read simply as reception history. Goetschel begins by setting up the cultural context in New York, in which Heine stood for a concern with the position and function of Jewish identity in modernity, at the point when Critical Theory emerged. Although there were serious disagreements about his standing (chiefly from Politzer), through journals and in debates Löwenthal and Horkheimer are enlisted as private enthusiasts or public advocates for Heine; in 1948 Adorno, exceptionally, reappraised Heine in a lecture delivered in English, eight years before his commemorative radio talk back in Germany in 1956; and Hannah Arendt, more sharply, welcomed Heine's resistance to assimilation and the confidence trick of world-citizenship as 'the most uncompromising of Europe's fighters for freedom'. This context of American Jewish reception is followed by a sketch of Heine's place in the work that laid the foundations of Critical Theory in Marx, Nietzsche and Freud. Marx and Nietzsche borrow his stylistic bravura, and Marx was familiar with his social thinking from the time of their collaboration in Paris. Nietzsche repeatedly voiced his admiration. Although the attempt to associate the Jewish travesty of 'Der Apollogott' in Heine's late collection Romanzero with the Nietzschean alignment of Dionysus and Apollo is more of a stretch, the relevance of Heine's moral attack on Ludwig Börne for Nietzsche's notion of ressentiment in The Genealogy of Morals is fully apparent. Finally, for Freud, Heine can illustrate aspects of psychoanalytic theory, and helps to work out its implications 'as a crucial interlocutor' whose strategies of satirical or political dissimulation are parallel to the Freudian mechanism of displacement.

While this reception sets the broad framework of Goetschel's arguments, the particular connection to Critical Theory is presented in terms of the idea of dissonance in Adorno's Aesthetic Theory and Heine's style -- related to irony and wit in the well-known poems 'Das Fräulein stand am Meere' and Heine's 'Lorelei' -- as a loss of harmony in the moment of disenchantmemt that is also liberating. Adorno is said to allow a conceptually more precise account of Heine's strategy and thought, because Adorno reclaims the dissonant as a moment of truth. In recognizing that 'the aesthetic is the continuation of critique by other means' (p. 96), Goetschel identifies a structural homology between Heine's writings and the functions of the aesthetic as defined by Adorno, including the restoration of the body to its prime position for any critique of happiness.

This is all pursued in an important discussion of Adorno's two Heine essays. The 1956 essay is well known, and sensitive to the context of the Federal Republic and the GDR. The earlier American Reappraisal is valuably presented as a recognition of the aesthetic function of Heine's irony: not ending every poem with suicide, as Eichendorff thought, but 'overcoming a problematic state of mind by giving voice to it' (p. 101). Finally, 'Heine the Wound' of 1956/58, taking up material from the Californian essay, stresses the effects of the failure of Jewish emancipation. But here the claim about Jewish linguistic inauthenticity is co-opted to an argument about critical difference that dissolves any role for 'an exclusionary linguistic nationalism'. Turning back to the Pictures of Travel, Goetschel finds Adorno's notions of emancipatory dissonance prefigured in Heine's divagatory prose.

Goetschel then considers the theory of language: the next major textual witness is once again well-known. 'On Wings of Song' ('Auf Flügeln des Gesanges') is said to stage a play of (Derridean) 'differance [sic]' -- 'that is, deferral and delay' (p. 116) -- in which the search for meaning is transformed into the process of signification. This exposition reads like a primer in semiotics, emphasizing textual self-referentiality though without any attention to the phonetic disruptions of rhyme (Köln/Welln). Heine's famous gag in The Harz Journey that presents four words on a 'redacted' page and hence among a sea of dashes 'The German censors - - - - - - - - . . . blockheads' is said to set a hermeneutic snare. Goethe and a Goethean view of irony are enlisted to define the fundamental slippages of the production of meaning -- in a cheerfully deconstructive set of assumptions. And this brings Goetschel back to 'Mauscheln' (the German Jewish accent or dialect) as an opening for difference in the supposed normativity and nationalism of High German. This is followed through in a discussion of Heine's The City of Lucca in which the persiflage of Hegel, Schelling and the Romantic take on 'Naturphilosophie' provides an opportunity to seek out the logic of a poetic language that 'lacks the power to fully grasp what it suppresses' (p. 126). Heine's playful use of the concept of allegory along with the deployment of the preferred Romantic idea of the hieroglyph are said to unsettle the desired alignment of signifier and signified in German idealism. This turns out to 'performatively anticipate' (p. 128) Benjamin's discussion of allegory in his Trauerspiel book. Benjamin, of course, was both ignorant of -- and in large measure hostile to -- Heine; so this collocation of his discussion of allegory with Heine's seems particularly inopportune. Associating Benjamin's use of the Greek word 'eidos' with the German word for the Lizard who is Heine's protagonist ('Eidechs') in this part of the City of Lucca doesn't make it any more plausible.

Linguistic instability alongside Heine's games with speaking animals present the undoing of ontological assumptions about language and identity. By insisting on the performative nature of meaning and signification in Heine's texts, Goetschel can move towards an anti-foundational critique of origin and identity. He finds in Heine's Florentine Nights a kind of ventriloquism that relies on the voice of the other and 'challenges every claim to linguistic and cultural priority' (p. 136). (The same could be said of Ludwig Börne: a Memorial.) Goetschel's term for this co-inherence of different powers is 'displaced philology', and the notion of displacement allows him to evoke the centrality of exile as a term in Heine's critical posture and the movements of displacement in European culture and thought. Finally Heine appears as the champion of the particular in the face of Hegelian universalism; Heine's parody of the Idea in Hegel (in Ideas. The Book of Le Grand) 'resonates with the critical concerns articulated by Benjamin, Adorno, and the general thrust of the Frankfurt School it anticipates'. This seems to mean the Benjamin of the 'Epistemo-Critical Prologue' and the Adorno of Negative Dialectics. An allusion to Adorno's argument about non-identity and the particular makes clear the extent to which Goetschel's exposition is a reading of Heine through Adorno, a not incompatible reading either, always in the service of what in Heine resists assimilation.

By far the longest chapter in Goetschel's book surveys Heine's thinking on the nature of history and the question of temporality. This exposition of course raises issues central to Goetschel's own project in tracing the deferred 'momentum of Heine's legacy' (p. 87). Marx's famous dictum in the Eighteenth Brumaire is hunted down not in Hegel but in Heine's essay On the History of Philosophy and Religion in Germany, as 'After the tragedy comes the farce.' Heine is claimed as the pioneer of a critical and dialectical understanding of history, which on the basis of scattered allusions and of Marx's close friendship in Paris makes Heine's essay a 'source text for historical materialism'. Heine's book The Romantic School, on the other hand, is said to reject linear views of history in favor of an aporetic simultaneity of continuity and discontinuity 'as constituents of the aftereffect we call history' (p. 155). This is very close to being a statement of Goetschel's own method. He teases out the notion of constellation as a paraphrase of Heine's project of a literary astrology, to bring him into the ambit of Benjamin's epistemology. A passage at the start of part 3 of Book III of The Romantic School on the existence of great books as the effect of Ideas does indeed seem reminiscent of the passage on the nature of Ideas in Benjamin's 'Epistemo-Critical Prologue': Heine writes 'Great deeds, like great books . . . are the result of necessity, they are connected with the course of the sun, moon and stars' -- and Benjamin 'Just as the harmony of the spheres depends on the orbits of the stars which do not come into contact with each other, so the mundus intelligibilis depends on the unbridgeable distance between pure essences' (Origin of the German Tragic Drama, p. 37).

Heine's conceptions of historical eventuation in the draft introduction to his History of Religion and Philosophy in Germany are shown to parallel Nietzsche's categories in On Truth and Lies . . . ; and the representation of history 'through figures of anticipation, delay and deferral' in 'the rearview mirror of deferred time and action' seen in Heine's essay on Paul Delaroche in French Painters, and particularly 'Cromwell and the corpse of Charles I', once more mirror Goetschel's own project. The patchwork of Heine's historiographical theorizing is completed by deferred Messianism in Ludwig Börne, Freudian 'Nachträglichkeit', and Heine's own articulations of Jewish tradition and its disruptions.

For all the proximity to Marx claimed here for Heine, his specifically political interests properly surface in relation to his engagement with Saint Simon and the 'rehabilitation of the flesh'. Spinoza proves to be the critical impetus for Heine's 'politics of emancipation', against the established authorities of Kant, Hegel and the Idealists, and enabling a reimagining of the individual in society, politics, culture, and ethics. Spinoza's dual-aspect theory is taken to be the inspiration for Heine's commitment to human liberation as a rehabilitation of matter that overcomes the separation of spirit and flesh. The restoration of the rights of the body and its affects opens up a comic style that could well be defined in Bakhtinian terms -- of carnival, grotesque, and the primacy of laughter -- and which is represented by Heine's versions of Don Quixote and Sancho Panza. The pair are projected, in their turn, as Adorno's inflection of Marx's account of the material determination of consciousness. Once again Negative Dialectics provides, as a kind of summation of Heine's presence to Marx and Freud, a theoretically rigorous recapitulation of what Heine had already envisaged.

From the politics of emancipation the book moves to Heine's critique of religion. Far-reaching arguments around secularization are identified that point to the work of Adorno and his contemporaries. Goetschel cleverly draws attention to the Lucca episodes of Heine's Pictures of Travel that have a Jewish inflection; Jewish converts to Catholicism and Protestantism generate a 'Jewish comedy of supersession' (p. 229), to demonstrate the intrication of religion and secularization, when a pale Galilean, conquering, rendered the once Olympian world 'grey and gloomy' (The City of Lucca VI). In Goetschel's reading, the process of secularization is never simply done with: Heine shows the 'entwinement' of the spiritual and the sensual, the religious and the secular. The review of Heine's account of Christianity returns to his History of Religion and Philosophy in Germany to emphasize his interest in the socio-political determinants of religion in a dialectic of emancipatory promise and the lure of power.

Goetschel concludes with a short essay on Heine's early and unfinished narrative The Rabbi of Bacherach. Jewish tradition is offered as a constantly renewed resource in the face of persecution and historical vulnerability. Heine's constant foregrounding of and identification with this German Jewish identity has been the insight that drives Goetschel's reading of Critical Theory, as a reminder of these forgotten precedents of its formation.

It should be noted that the book would have benefitted from closer proof-reading. There are a large number of typographical errors and incorrect references. The writing itself is sometimes overheated to the point of pleonasm ('throws illuminating light'; 'comedically farcical'). This is a shame.


Walter Benjamin, The Origin of the German Tragic Drama, New York: Verso, 1977.

Willi Goetschel, The Discipline of Philosophy and the Invention of Modern Jewish Thought, New York: Fordham University Press, 2015.

Friedrich Nietzsche, On the Genealogy of Morals, edited and translated with an introduction by Douglas Smith, Oxford: Oxford World Classics, 2008.