Henry More, 1614-1687: A Biography of the Cambridge Platonist

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Robert Crocker, Henry More, 1614-1687: A Biography of the Cambridge Platonist, Kluwer, 2003, 292pp, $130.00 (hbk), ISBN 140201402.

Reviewed by Jasper Reid, University of Aberdeen


In his own day, with Hobbes acknowledged but still generally despised, and with Locke yet to burst onto the scene, Henry More was arguably the leading philosophical authority in Britain. To be sure, he was not without his critics: but, to observe just one illustration of the degree of respect he enjoyed from his contemporaries, one might mention Margaret Cavendish’s Philosophical Letters of 1664, in which the author presented extensive discussions of the ideas of those figures she considered to be the pre-eminent intellectuals of the time. As startling as it may seem to the modern reader, not only was Cavendish happy to place More alongside such giants as Hobbes, Descartes, J.B. van Helmont and William Harvey: she actually saw fit to devote more pages of her book to More than to Hobbes and Descartes put together!

For reasons that are clear enough to anyone familiar with More’s writings, he did subsequently fall out of favour. Philosophy moved on and he got left behind, and it is true that this new work by Robert Crocker is scarcely likely to appeal to a mass audience. It is priced accordingly, which will no doubt put off many of its more casual potential readers: but that is a pity, because this book does have a great deal to commend it.

With historians of philosophy increasingly turning away from an anachronistically imposed canon in favour of a more sophisticated appreciation of early modern thought, more sensitive to its historical context, any new addition to the growing but still small body of secondary literature on More should be welcomed, and not just by More scholars, but by historians of seventeenth century philosophy at large. But especially welcome will be a work from Robert Crocker, a scholar of almost unparalleled erudition. Crocker draws upon a wider array of sources than probably any other commentator on More has hitherto done. Indeed, perhaps the most useful contribution that Henry More, 1614-1687: A Biography of the Cambridge Platonist makes lies in its sixty three page bibliography, comprising not only More’s own works, relevant contemporary works and recent secondary literature—probably the fullest list yet offered—but also heavily annotated lists of all known Morean manuscripts and letters, both published and unpublished. Needless to say, Crocker has also made use of this material in the body of the text itself. He discusses many sources which have never been properly discussed in the secondary literature before, and some which have never been so much as mentioned before.

Much of the book is given over to studies of the various debates in which More engaged over the course of his career. Quite aside from any intrinsic interest that More’s philosophy may or may not be deemed to have, his polemical position at the very centre of a large number of diverse debates, over the course of a career spanning nearly half a century, is firmly assured. The Cambridge Platonists have often been presented as mere backward-looking antiquarians, but this is a grave distortion in general, and all the more so in More’s case. He placed himself very much at the cutting edge, and participated in many of the hottest new debates of the day. In the 1640s, he was corresponding with Descartes on an array of philosophical matters. In the 1680s, he was discussing prophecy (at the very least—quite possibly other issues too) with Newton. Along the way from the one to the other, he encountered, in one shape or form, nearly all of the great and the good of his time, from Hobbes to Boyle to Spinoza (together also, it has to be said, with some of the not so great and the not very good at all). Crocker examines most of these encounters in some detail and, although some have already been studied in detail before by other commentators (e.g. those with Thomas Vaughan, Boyle and, of course, Descartes), others have been largely passed over (e.g. those with Joseph Beaumont, John Webster and d Henry Stubbe). Anyone with a special interest in any of More’s interlocutors, regardless of what they might feel about More himself, would be well advised to see what Crocker has to say on their debate. Perhaps most intriguingly of all, Crocker discovers and discusses an unpublished, unfinished and hitherto overlooked manuscript Treatise of Natural Philosophy by John Finch, More’s former pupil and brother of his dear friend, Anne Conway. If Crocker’s assessment is to be trusted—and there seems no good reason not to trust it—this work (held in the Leicester Record Office) is an important example of empiricist thought in Britain in the years between Hobbes and Locke. It deserves to be better known, and would surely warrant and reward further research.

In the course of this survey of More’s various encounters with other authors, Crocker manages to examine most of the central, idiosyncratic planks of More’s own philosophy—the pre-existence of the soul, the limits of mechanism and the theory of the Spirit of Nature, the theory of spiritual extension and the divinity of space, etc.—and he does not shy away from topics that were important to More, just because they might seem less important to our twenty first century eyes. For instance, modern readers will often either smile or frown upon More for his penchant for telling ghost stories, but Crocker respectfully devotes an entire chapter to the topic: and rightly so, because, for More, this was very far from being merely a quaintly naïve eccentricity. From the point of view of his fundamental goals and rhetorical methodology, his extensive discussions of witches and demons made perfect sense and, indeed, were integral to his work. More wanted to lead his readers towards a belief in a world of immaterial spirits—and, by extension, an ultimate spiritual principle in God—but he was also conscious that his audience was not limited to trained philosophers, the sort of people who could reasonably be expected to respond to dryly rigorous, logical arguments for this immaterial reality. He wished to draw less sophisticated, more sensual readers into such a belief too, and he felt that the best way to do this would be to stir up their imaginations with tales of apparitions. In essence, if he could not reason them into a belief in spirits, he might nevertheless be able to scare them into one. It is to Crocker’s credit that he is willing to acknowledge this area of More’s thought, and to give it the attention that it is due.

If there is one common thread in Crocker’s book, to link these various topics and these various debates together, it is an emphasis on the devotional aspect of More’s writings. As Crocker notes in his Conclusion, ’As I have tried to show in this volume, More’s various apologetic efforts, and the many controversies that resulted from them, grew out of this necessitarian theology of illuminism and spiritual perfectionism, and its emphasis on the need for a continuing personal choice between self-will and self-denial that, More believed, would open up the believer to the spiritual journey towards perfection and illumination promised in the Gospel.’ (p. 199). The Index proper, at the rear of the book, is preceded by a separate block of references for seven specific keywords and phrases: ’Animal Life’, ’Cabbala’, ’Divine Body’, ’Divine Life’, ’New Birth’, ’Self-denial’, ’Self-love’. The focus on such themes makes for a novel and instructive slant on More’s writings. Maybe it would be wrong to focus on such spiritual and religious notions to the exclusion of the more detached and abstract metaphysics—which Crocker does not do—but it would be no less improper to construct a strictly philosophical presentation of More, divorced from the work’s religious and, indeed, ethical dimension. Even the most abstruse, logical arguments in More’s writings, on ostensibly very remote issues, were still quite consciously directed towards an overarching goal: to lead his reader towards a correct understanding of and a proper devotion for God and His spiritual Kingdom.

It was a fine line that More walked, on the one hand taking on board large parts of the mechanical New Science, while at the same time seeking after the sort of spiritual perfection that Crocker emphasises. The task that More set himself, of Platonising Democritus, was always bound to be a tall order, and he was and still is often criticised (rightly or wrongly) for veering too far in one direction or the other. Sometimes his treatment of the spiritual world is considered quasi-materialistic (see pp. 134, 174); on other occasions, the ’illuminism’ that Crocker discusses is deemed to have led him down the slippery slope into enthusiasm (in the seventeenth century sense, of a deluded conviction that one has been individually elected to receive a direct and personal revelation of divine truth). But, from More’s own point of view, it was critical to chart a central course, keeping well clear of both the enthusiastic Scylla and the mechanical Charybdis. He viewed the excesses of the enthusiasts, and the (covert or overt) materialist atheism of the mechanists, as constituting two of the most dangerous threats to true religion. Crocker rightly devotes extensive discussions to More’s critiques of these twin evils, and he also discusses many other subordinate threats, such as (to borrow some of More’s own exotic neologisms) nullibism, holenmerianism and psychopyrism.

It is perhaps to be lamented, however, that Crocker does not do more to confront the problems that arguably do surround More’s illuminism, in the light of his vigorous opposition to enthusiasm. Crocker is certainly sensitive to this tension: he refers, for instance, to More’s ’recognition of a genuine kinship between his own illuminist aspirations […] and those of his enthusiast opponents’ (p. 54). But, given that Crocker has deliberately chosen to make the former one of the central themes of his study, a rather fuller and more analytic discussion from him on More’s distinction between true illumination and false illumination might have proved especially instructive. The same might also be said about the relations between More’s own notion of a ’new birth’ and the orthodox Calvinist doctrine that he rejected. Crocker touches on this latter point very briefly (p. 6), but, here too, there is scope for a much fuller examination of the soundness of the distinction that More was endeavouring to draw. Was More’s position really a consistent one at all, or did his doctrines and proclivities inadvertently and no doubt unwittingly lead him towards an implicit endorsement of a position he abhorred? In a word, was he genuinely capable of resisting Scylla’s alluring call? It is a question that deserves an answer, and Crocker seemed like he might be the man to give it to us (let others take care of the Charybdis side of things). But an answer can only come at the end of a detailed critical analysis, and such an analysis is lacking from this work.

Also regrettable is the fact that Crocker does not offer any in-depth analysis of More’s critique of Roman Catholicism, arguably the number one topic in his more directly theological works. As Crocker himself acknowledges, More viewed Catholicism, atheism and enthusiasm ’as three interrelated expressions of the ’mystery of iniquity’ assailing both the individual and the Church.’ (p. 45). It is therefore a pity that, whereas we are provided with extensive discussions of atheism and enthusiasm, when it comes to Catholicism, we have to make do with just a few scattered remarks.

But, if these are criticisms, they are benign ones: the material that we have is of a nature to leave the audience wanting more, and that is no bad thing. From the point of view of the material that Crocker does include, it is highly informative and it seems to be, to all intents and purposes, entirely accurate from start to finish. One example of a very small error, just to illustrate the nature of the ’to all intents and purposes’ in that last sentence, may be found on p. 150, where Crocker discusses ’the argument (developed in the Enchiridion Metaphysicum) that all bodies must move through an ’inner immobile extension’, “whose existence our minds are quite unable to doubt”, and which he considered to be the ’bare possibility of matter’.’ The trouble is that this conflates a theory that had been presented in More’s early works, such as the philosophical poems of the 1640s, with that presented in 1671’s Enchiridion Metaphysicum (Crocker refers to both in his endnote to this remark). In the former, More did indeed suggest that space could be understood as the bare possibility of matter, but in the latter he quite deliberately set about refuting that very notion (see Enchiridion Metaphysicum, ch. 7, §§12-14). But, if Crocker’s slips are confined to details such as this—scarcely important, when taken within its context—then he does not have much to worry about.

As we observed at the outset, the audience for a new work on Henry More is inevitably going to be a small one. But fans of More will cherish this work and, indeed, any serious student of early modern thought in general would be likely to find it interesting and informative. It is rather a case of: if you only read one book on Henry More, you could do far worse than to make it this one.