Henry Sidgwick: Eye of the Universe. An Intellectual Biography

Placeholder book cover

Schultz, Bart, Henry Sidgwick: Eye of the Universe. An Intellectual Biography, Cambridge University Press, 2004, 878pp, $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521829674.

Reviewed by Robert Shaver, University of Manitoba


When Henry Sidgwick arrived at Cambridge from Rugby in 1855, he was a star pupil in classics and a devout Anglican. The former quality prospered at Cambridge; he took up a Fellowship upon graduating. The latter quality did not prosper, largely due to Sidgwick's experience of the Apostles, the secret society devoted to unconstrained and intimate conversation that he found his most significant and pleasurable intellectual experience. He spent much of the 60's learning Hebrew and Arabic and studying the original sources of the Bible. In 1869, after years of "storm and stress" (which included asking Mill for advice), he gave up his Fellowship because he could no longer agree to the Thirty-Nine Articles (containing, for example, belief in the virgin birth), subscription to which was a condition of the Fellowship. Sidgwick's reasoning was utilitarian (he found no clear guidance from common-sense morality) -- the bad effects of hypocritical subscription outweigh the good effects of retaining within the Church or University those intelligent enough to have doubts. Cambridge responded by giving Sidgwick the (less lucrative) post of Lecturer which did not require subscription; subscription was abolished for Fellowships, in part due to Sidgwick's example, two years later. From this crisis came both Sidgwick's reputation for integrity and his masterpiece, The Methods of Ethics (1874). Methods argues that common-sense morality, when systematised so as to give guidance, agrees with utilitarianism; utilitarianism, like common-sense morality, is based on self-evident moral claims rather than the apparently psychological facts adduced by Mill; the real fight is between utilitarianism and rational egoism; there seems no way to decide between utilitarianism and egoism, and so, unless the action that maximises the general happiness always coincides with the action that maximises the individual's happiness, "the Cosmos of Duty is thus really reduced to a Chaos" (Methods, first edition, 473).

Much of this may be familiar to students of the Methods. But one of the great merits of Eye of the Universe is the stress it puts on features of Sidgwick's life that are less likely to be familiar.

(i) Sidgwick spent much of the 80's and 90's guiding the Society for Psychical Research. Always hopeful and always disappointed, Sidgwick looked for empirical evidence of survival of bodily death. Such evidence could make religious belief more rational and show the possibility of a coincidence between utilitarianism and egoism. One medium after another proved fraudulent -- although, late in life, Sidgwick did think Mrs. Piper merited more study, and after his death she convinced many of the sceptical. The SPR also pioneered the investigation of telepathy and hypnosis. Phantasms of the Living, for example, solicited and investigated reports in which impressions, voices or figures of those experiencing a crisis (especially death) occur, by no ordinary perceptual route, in the minds of friends or family. Phantasms and the Census of Hallucinations argue that this occurs far more often than chance would indicate and that telepathy is the best explanation. (As the SPR noted, this makes it harder to prove survival of bodily death; for most of what an honest medium might communicate, telepathy from the living is a more likely explanation than communication from the dead.) Later, the SPR investigated reports of Sidgwick's posthumous communication. Unfortunately, none of these communications seem to throw light on, say, disputed interpretations of the Methods.

(ii) Sidgwick devoted much time and money to educational reform. He wished to reduce the place of classics and increase the role of the sciences; he worked to establish various university extension programmes; he helped to fund various teaching positions at Cambridge; most notably, in part by founding Newnham College, he managed, over time, to get women admitted to lectures and to write final exams (though he did not succeed in getting women the degree). This involved much careful manoeuvring. For example, Sidgwick opposed pressing for the degree in 1887 because he did not want women forced into taking the fourth-term Greek and Latin exam, required for men, that he thought was a bad requirement on anyone, and because he thought pressing would both fail and provoke a backlash against the gains already made.

(iii) Most of Sidgwick's close friends were gay; the best known is John Addington Symonds. This involved Sidgwick in a great deal of delicate counseling about publicity -- what studies and poems to publish (or how to modify them to admit safer construals), what risks in private life to take, and, in the case of Symonds's posthumous biography, based on his frank memoirs, what (massive) excisions to make so that emotional turmoil appears as religious doubt. (At one point, the editor of the biography wrote to Sidgwick that "if I came to this book as an outsider I should only gather from the Davos pages indications of a man who made warm friendships with many people not of his own class" (711).) This side of Sidgwick was in turn excised from his posthumous Memoir, edited by his wife Eleanor and (gay) brother Arthur.

(iv) After the Methods, Sidgwick wrote large Principles of Political Economy and Elements of Politics. Schultz stresses two aspects of these works. First, although Sidgwick presents himself as writing from traditional political economy, he makes a case for socialism. Second, Sidgwick acquiesces in the racism of his time. He speaks of "inferior" and "superior races," "civilised" and "uncivilised" societies; he gives utilitarian, paternalistic arguments for the expansion of the "civilised nations" without exhibiting knowledge of the "uncivilised" ones; he uses "nigger" occasionally in correspondence; his opposition to the Boer war makes no reference to the black population; he does not see the need (as Schultz notes, "[a]stonishingly") to distinguish the duty and the interest of the civilising nations; he respected and relied on works by his friends James Bryce and Charles Henry Pearson which were much more virulent (especially Pearson), and must have lived with the same attitudes from his student, friend, and brother-in-law, Arthur Balfour.

I am not sure that the evidence for racism is as damning as Schultz thinks. Schultz himself presents a counter-case: Sidgwick sees no evidence of "racial debasement" from mixing races or for inherent racial differences in morality or intelligence, and indeed, given the times, says remarkably little about race at all; he criticises those who think civilisation is "a monopoly of the white race;" he sees the evil side of colonisation and favours careful protection of the colonised; he demands that the colonised receive the same educational opportunities as the colonisers. It is true, and disturbing, that Sidgwick's treatment of Pearson's National Life and Character makes no mention of its racism. But the whole (quite short) discussion of Pearson is not in a straightforward review of his book -- in which omitting Pearson on race might indeed be strange -- but rather in a paper on "Political Prophecy and Sociology," in which Pearson is discussed for his "empirical" method of grounding predictions (as opposed to a grounding in purported "laws of social evolution"). Still, given Sidgwick's (self-described) "cold corrosive scepticism" elsewhere, one might have expected more.

One benefit of a good intellectual biography is that the reader sees connections in both life and (often obscure) work that are not evident when concentrating only on the famous texts. Sometimes this illuminates the famous texts themselves. For example, in a letter, Sidgwick writes that he "could not endure an unjust universe, in which Good Absolute was not also good for each." This suggests that his concern with reconciling utilitarianism and egoism may not rest solely on giving arguments for utilitarianism and rational egoism and their inconsistency, but rather on a foundational concern with justice (449). A different sort of example is the attack in the Methods on common-sense notions of "pure" sexual relations. When Sidgwick argues that "the repression of sexual license" may not be necessary either for an individual's perfection -- "we can hardly know a priori that this lower [merely sensual] kind of relation interferes with the development of the higher (nor indeed does experience seem to show that this is universally the case)" -- or for maintaining the population, or that common sense here gives "practical guidance to common people in common circumstances," it is illuminating to realise that Sidgwick probably has homosexuality, Symonds, and Symonds's work on ancient Greece in mind, though there is no trace of this in the Methods (514-5).

Here are two more complex examples.

(i) The Methods is infamous for recommending that a utilitarian elite sometimes publicise one set of rules for "the vulgar" but follow, or privately recommend, a different set of rules itself. The issue arises when a more complex rule would, if followed, bring more happiness, but generally promulgating it would bring less, since it may be hard to follow and may undermine adherence to other rules. Schultz shows that this problem, of how an elite should deal with the vulgar, runs throughout Sidgwick's concerns. On one hand, Sidgwick does not publicise the severity of his religious doubts, since he takes religious belief to be necessary for supporting morality in the vulgar; he consistently counsels his gay friends in favour of secrecy, given the hostile reception he expected publicity to receive; the doings of the Apostles are best kept secret, given the expected reaction of the Anglican establishment; in cases, like perhaps Paraguay, where "an enlightened few" govern "a docile multitude," a "fictitious theology for the good of the community" could possibly be justified. On the other hand, he recommends that dons and clerics (at least in England) not explicitly profess one thing while believing another, and he harshly condemns the hypocrisy of party politicians.

Like the example of Symonds and sexual purity, these examples show how the approach of the Methods applies to particular cases. Kantian or Rawlsian transparency has its place -- one dictated by an estimate of costs and benefits. Another upshot of the examples might correct, rather than simply illustrate, claims in the Methods.[1] Many interpreters of the Methods think consistency with common-sense morality provides epistemic support. But consistency with the views of those who would persecute Symonds is not an epistemic virtue. Thus when Sidgwick claims that he need not discuss "how we are to ascertain the 'experts' on whose 'consensus' we are to rely" and that the "morality that I examine in Book iii is my own morality as much as it is any man's," he is disingenuous, and becomes open to Schultz's worry that he sometimes chooses bad experts such as Pearson (Methods, 343n, xii).[2]

(ii) Critics of the Methods worry that Sidgwick says little to support egoism. Egoism seems neither well supported by common sense morality nor self-evident. Nor is it clear how the passage Sidgwick inserted as explanation helps -- "the distinction between any one individual and any other is real and fundamental, and … consequently 'I' am concerned with the quality of my existence in a sense, fundamentally important, in which I am not concerned with the quality of the existence of other individuals" (Methods, 498). One interpretation holds that here Sidgwick is denying a reductionist view of personal identity. Earlier he had challenged egoism by means of a reductionist view -- "[g]rant that … the permanent identical 'I' is not a fact but a fiction … why, then, should one part of the series of feelings into which the Ego is resolved be concerned with another part of the same series, any more than with any other series?"-- so the passage is then at least addressing that challenge (Methods, 419). One problem is that Sidgwick does not explain in his philosophical writings what is wrong with a reductionist view. (Indeed, Schultz publishes, for the first time, an 1870 letter in which Sidgwick seems to agree with a memory theory (441).)

Here Schultz makes the absolutely intriguing suggestion that Sidgwick's work for the SPR is relevant: "Although [Sidgwick's] profound aversion to materialism and guarded optimism about the possibility of personal survival do not quite in themselves yield a metaphysical defense of a nonreductionist view of personal identity, the larger dimensions of his project -- the emergent depth psychology, including the sense of the uncanny that came from his experiences in interviewing the people reporting 'phenomena' -- point to the ground of his unshakeable sense of the logical priority of egoism, of egoism as a reflection of the true self that somehow endured" (333). But this suggestion needs more fleshing out. (a) Evidence of survival is consistent with a reductionist view: the "series of feelings" simply extends past the death of the body. Further argument is needed to show that an identity-making soul is required to house these feelings; understandably, Sidgwick is even more sceptical about speculation here than he is about survival. (b) Suppose, as F. W. Myers -- a close friend of Sidgwick, SPR participant, and proponent of such speculations -- put it, each is "an abiding psychical entity far more extensive than he knows" (366). This may be a problem for a reductionist view that takes only conscious mental states to be relevant. We might think we survive large failures in connectedness of conscious states provided there is sufficient connectedness in unconscious states. But we might not think this; and even if we did, the reductionist need only add unconscious states, rather than move to (say) nonreductionist souls. Moreover, in a case of large failure of connectedness in conscious states but sufficient connectedness in unconscious states, the problem for rational egoism remains (perhaps magnified): why should I care more about my future self, to whom I am connected by unconscious states, than about another present or future person who shares my present conscious goals? (c) A nonreductionist view would not show the priority or truth of egoism. At best (and as Schultz notes earlier), it would show that one objection to egoism, based on a reductionist view, fails.[3]

Overall, Eye is excellent. Perhaps Schultz sometimes overstates how much difference his research makes to the interpretation of the Methods (as opposed to the interpretation of Sidgwick the man). Learning what Sidgwick has in mind often illuminates without showing that the Methods should not be treated "innocently," as the work of "a slightly senior contemporary" (20). Perhaps, more generally, addicts to the "pure white light" of Sidgwick's careful arguments may wish for less "Apostolic soaring" from Schultz (and wish this even more from some of Sidgwick's friends, who are quoted liberally). But, in part because he does quote so liberally, Schultz virtually always gives the reader the evidence on which to judge any soaring, whether the issue be Sidgwick's racism or his feminism or the proper interpretation of the Methods. (For the last, Schultz rehearses at length not only the usual bits of Sidgwick, but also all of the recent critical controversies, bringing any moral philosopher up to speed.) And the reward is a Sidgwick connected not only to the usual suspects, such as Mill, Bradley, Rashdall, Spencer, Green, and Bloomsbury, but also to Madame Blavatsky, William James, Arnold, Maurice, Clough, Pater, Whitman, Ellis, Renan, Lord Lytton, and, among our contemporaries, to Edward Said and Eve Sedgwick. (Contrast Sidgwick's own short intellectual autobiographies which mention a rather more staid bunch: Mill, Comte, Renan, Whewell, Kant, Hobbes, Butler, More, Clarke, Aristotle, and Bentham.)

The index is very comprehensive. The notes are a tremendous reference -- Schultz seems to have read everything -- but, alas, are placed at the end of the book.[4]

[1] The examples also bear on Jerry Schneewind's view that for Sidgwick, all normal adults have an equal ability to engage in moral discussion. For the debate, see the exchange between Schultz and Schneewind in Utilitas 16, 2004.

[2] Schultz also argues that Sidgwick may take common-sense morality to be dependent on belief in Christianity, and so worried that common-sense morality might change radically, perhaps in the direction of supporting egoism. This is a neat suggestion, although the textual evidence for it is inconclusive. (a) Schultz notes that Sidgwick takes the vulgar to act morally only given belief in a Christian afterlife. This seems a point about what the vulgar would do, rather than about what the vulgar would say one ought to do (e.g., 248). (b) Sidgwick illustrates that common sense employs a notion of "good absolutely" when it claims that "the design of the Creator of the world is to realise Good." Since Sidgwick offers this merely as an example, it does not show that he is worried that "the moral content of common sense might be dependent on religious belief" (246).

[3] Schultz is a bit generous about what supports egoism elsewhere as well. For example, he notes that Sidgwick writes that "I feel … incapable of really comprehending the state of mind of one who does not desire the continuance of his personal being." Schultz asks "[h]ow, without appeal to some form of egoism (interested or disinterested) could one possibly understand the force of the pervasive concern for personal survival of physical death?" But noting how much I care about my continuance does not show that I ought to do so. And insofar as Sidgwick explains this concern -- he notes that "[a]ll the activities in which I truly live seem to carry with them the same demand for the 'wages of going on'" -- the thought seems to be that continuance is important as a means to various projects, not just the project of maximising one's own happiness (220). Later, Schultz quotes Sidgwick's admission that "[w]hether if this pleasure [in living] failed I could rely on myself to live from a pure sense of duty I do not really know." Schultz comments that "[t]his would appear to be about as plain an affirmation of the rationality of egoism as one could want from Sidgwick -- he is not sure that he himself is up to living 'from a pure sense of duty'" (461-2). But Sidgwick is more naturally read as making a point about motivation, not rationality.

[4] Thanks to Joyce Jenkins, Rhonda Martens, and Bart Schultz for comments on an earlier draft.