Herbert Spencer and the Invention of Modern Life

Placeholder book cover

Mark Francis, Herbert Spencer and the Invention of Modern Life, Cornell University Press, 2007, 434pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780801445903.

Reviewed by Pamela Lyon, University of Adelaide


In this extraordinary book Mark Francis sets himself a Herculean task worthy of his subject. Not only does he aim to resurrect, in meticulous detail, the complex intellectual contribution of a mid-Victorian philosopher whom most today, if they thought of him at all, would consider best forgotten, he also aims to show how Herbert Spencer both presaged and embodied many of the qualities we associate with modernity. Spencer was a pre-Darwinian evolutionary psychologist who advocated a faith grounded in science, who considered rationality and emotion equally important yet aimed to accomplish the ultimate analysis, a systematic synthesis of all knowledge of the living world, and an anti-authoritarian, anti-aristocratic, anti-utilitarian liberal who was deeply suspicious of democracy. This is no mere rehabilitation. It is, rather, a forensic in situ re-examination of a would-be Prometheus whose vast corpus has come down to us in a perversely distorted form -- a legacy for which Spencer bears no small responsibility. The irony of the Spencerian absence from contemporary consideration is that, in his own day, this odd personality enjoyed a popular and scholarly celebrity beyond the wildest imagining of most contemporary philosophers (well, those outside France anyway), due to his out-sized contributions to diverse fields, including religion, psychology, sociology, education and politics, as well as philosophy. Yet it is not to valorize Spencer as a "great man" that Francis undertakes this mighty revision, but, rather, so that he will be better appreciated as (among other things) "a precursor of the modern taste for self-doubt and alienation" (p.12). Although not flawless, the final product is a tour de force, rendered in some of the most delightful scholarly prose I have read in many a year.

These days Herbert Spencer is mostly remembered as the source of the phrase "survival of the fittest", the father of Social Darwinism and the philosophical legitimator of laissez faire capitalism. With painstaking attention to historical context, Francis untangles the skein of misapprehension about and distortion of Spencer's thought, of which these notions are a part. Yes, Spencer described Darwinian natural selection as "survival of the fittest", but as a critic not as a convert -- much as astronomer Fred Hoyle disparagingly introduced the phrase "big bang" to describe what is now the most popular theory of the origin of the universe. As Francis is at pains to point out, Spencer's unique developmental view of evolution -- advanced well before the 1859 publication of Origin of Species -- led him to see evolving nature not only as universally progressive and leading to greater complexity ("heterogeneity") but also as largely beneficent, which he construed as a warrant for hope and a foundation for faith -- a view that became increasingly tough to maintain post-Origin. Francis's anecdote about Spencer's sole public speaking engagement on his only trip to America provides a delicious example of just how misunderstood Spencer's views were (at any given time) even in his own day. On 9 November 1882, two hundred of the mercantile/industrial elite gathered at Delmonico's in New York for a gala banquet to bid farewell to the eminent Englishman, whose putative views on the progressive nature of unfettered capitalism and the necessity for noninterventionist government had won him a large following in America. Having already upset the local business community with the pronouncement, in an interview with a US periodical, that government activity should be expanded -- not restricted -- in its "special sphere, the maintenance of equitable relations among citizens" (p. 103), Spencer proceeded to lecture the assembly on the falsity of the "gospel of work", pressing the need not only for relaxation but also the prudent redirection of energies away from incessant production and the determined pursuit of wealth. "There needs to be a revised ideal of life," he said. "… Life is not for learning, nor is life for working, but learning and working are for life" (p. 104).

To explain how such gross misunderstandings were possible -- and they occurred in a number of areas of Spencer's life and thought -- and to ascertain what ideas Spencer actually advanced, when and roughly why, is the ambitious aim of this marvelous book. Francis undertakes to show how Spencer evolved from an idealistic progressive who hoped to provide a scientific foundation for religion, morality, and the understanding of human behaviour into a progressively disillusioned one, an evolution of which Spencer himself was painfully aware. Moreover, Francis demonstrates how Spencer actively contributed to public misunderstanding of his views in two major ways. First, Spencer's thought was constantly changing, in some cases quite radically, over the course of his long life; he died aged 83. As one speaks of Wittgenstein of the Tractatus and of Philosophical Investigations, meaning almost two different thinkers, it seems plausible to speak of the early Spencer (idealistic progressive, cheerleader for Western civilization, advocate of women's rights) and the later Spencer (ambivalent about technological progress and women's suffrage, fretfully optimistic). Unfortunately, the monumentally prolific Spencer rarely signalled these (sometimes substantial) changes of emphasis or view from one work to the next. Not only did he retain from work to work the continuity of his general evolutionary framework -- the idea that living things constantly adapt to environmental circumstances by adjusting their internal 'relations' to external ones -- large chunks of earlier works were recycled. Sometimes changes in position, in subsequent editions or new works, amounted to the omission of a critical phrase in a restatement of principle. Thus, only a literary sleuth with access to diverse sources of information (like Francis) could have hoped to follow Spencer's intellectual development. Even his admirers and adversaries found it difficult to keep track of Spencer's contradictory views.

Second, Spencer confounded or misled his readers (and no doubt his friends) by that most modern of preoccupations, the careful construction of a persona and an almost maniacal desire to control his public image. In the Introduction Francis explains the peculiar difficulties that Spencer presents to the biographer/historian, among them that he "was capable of deliberately misleading his readers, or even losing sight of what he saw as the truth," due only in part to a poor memory (p.4). Not only did Spencer recall and destroy much of his correspondence -- the better to retain control of the picture he left to posterity -- he spent nearly two decades writing, rewriting and polishing (Francis says as a kind of entertainment) his two-volume autobiography, a work of more than one thousand pages that Francis claims was intended, at last in part, as a cautionary tale for future generations. In contrast to the "monotonous, and seemingly honest, scientific prose" of Spencer's major technical works (p.18), An Autobiography was written with the self-mocking irony and intentional ambiguity characteristic of the English sensibility, which pervades many of Spencer's surviving letters and his favourite work of literature, The Life and Opinions of Tristram Shandy, Gentleman.

What makes this journey through Spencer's multi-faceted thought such pleasure is, in fact, the intrepid Francis. With the hard-won wisdom of the long-time companion -- the book took ten years to write -- Francis is fully aware of the faults and stratagems of his elusive subject, and thus is well qualified to disambiguate unreliable narratives. Francis deftly side-steps the roles of whiggish judge or apologist in his "attempt to adjudicate between [Spencer's] own explanations and the probable truth" (p. 327). To his credit Francis never reaches for a simplistic or facile summation when a nuanced, context-sensitive explication is required -- which, in the case of a slippery, contradictory, obsfucatory personality such as Spencer's, is pretty much all the time. Most refreshing, Francis maintains a profound compassion, even affection, for a man whose personal life was an abject failure.

The book is organized thematically within a four-part structure, which makes it a useful reference to the extent the groupings succeed, which they mostly do. (I have qualms about chapters in Part III, about which more in a moment.) A three-page historical chronology at the front of the book enables the reader to track temporal leaps as Francis explicates the development of particular strands of Spencer's thought (e.g., feminist politics, liberalism, psychology, sociology as ethical discipline) across the long span of his professional life. Francis does this with scrupulous attention to the context of Spencer's time, his precursors and contemporaries, as well as the events of the great autodidact's personal life. This is especially necessary in Spencer's case, according to Francis, not simply because his arguments were embedded in (mostly forgotten) nineteenth-century debates. Writes Francis:

Many texts can be intelligently read without knowledge of authorial intentions or behaviour, while Spencer's cannot. He lived his philosophy, and without a grasp of his aspirations, dislikes and personal responses his ideas appear uninspired and disconnected. (p. 4; my emphasis).

The book is long because Spencer's thought was large and extended into so many areas, not because his life was full of narrative incident. On the contrary, despite odd behaviour that earned him a berth in Dame Edith Sitwell's English Eccentrics (1933), Spencer's life was curiously barren. Part I ("An individual and his personal culture") sets out Spencer, the "private man", to date largely neglected by biographers and historians. This is the paradoxical scaffold upon which Francis builds the intellectual life: the childhood steeped in quasi-dissident Christian piety alongside a non-traditional, scientific education; the tempestuous homelife that made Spencer fear his own emotional expression would tend to violence, like his domineering father, but also made him an anti-authoritarian champion of women's rights, particularly in the domestic setting; the single passionate (unconsummated) affair of his life, with the novelist George Eliot; the impoverished years as a freelance writer, essayist and editor (including for The Economist) and the always-disappointing sales of his major works; his profound disinterest in property even as his wealth grew with his reputation; his abiding affection for children not his own and, following a breakdown induced by over-work, his advocacy of adult play; his chronic need to exhibit his individuality despite an incapacity to cope with the consequences of celebrity; finally, Spencer's virginity and his relentless hypochondria, considered excessive even by liberal Victorian standards, if no match for Darwin's, who was worse.

Part II ("The lost world of Spencer's metaphysics"), which sets out the philosophical background against which Spencer's work (according to Francis) only makes any sense, I found most surprising and engaging. Surprising because I had no idea that Anglophone novelists, essayists and scientists (if not necessarily philosophers) were already in considerable turmoil -- well before the Origin of Species -- as they grappled to rescue meaning, spirituality and a valid basis for morality from the picture of the universe ("only a collection of lifeless material objects and physical laws" (p. 111)) then emerging from science. Engaging because we are still grappling with similar issues today, in arguably far less sophisticated and nuanced ways. While the Protestant Reformation had reformed the relation between God and humankind, by removing the necessity for intercession, the New Reformation of the mid-nineteenth century aimed to reform the relation between the knowledge-generating and the spiritual natures of humankind, by replacing traditional superstition with science. Spencer, a philosophically minded thinker weaned on modern science (his father George was president of the Derby Philosophical Society co-founded by Erasmus Darwin, Charles' grandfather), was widely acknowledged as the prophet of the New Reformation. As T.H. Huxley wrote in 1860, in response to Spencer's ambitious plan for "A System of Synthetic Philosophy", which aimed to analyse all aspects of organic knowledge, it was important that "somebody should think out with a connected system -- the loose notions that are floating about more or less distinctly in all the best minds" (p. 147).

I had known, of course, that Huxley was 'Darwin's bulldog', acting as public defender of the theory of natural selection because the great man had no stomach for it, and that it is to Huxley we owe the term 'Agnosticism'. What I didn't know was that Huxley was at one time greatly influenced by Spencer, the prophet of "the Unknown", and remained his lifelong friend, taking care to curb his famously aggressive demeanour around Spencer even as their views on evolution, philosophy and religion gradually diverged. While Huxley's "gibe that Spencer's idea of tragedy was a deduction killed by a fact" is often recounted, Francis argues that the following passage, in a letter from Huxley to Spencer, is "more characteristic of the relationship between the two men":

It seems as if all of the thoughts in what you have written were my own and yet I am conscious of the enormous difference your presentation of them makes in my intellectual state. One is thought in the state of hemp yarn and the other in the state of rope. Work away thou excellent rope maker and make us more rope to hold on against the devil and the parsons. (p. 147)

Perhaps because I brought high expectations to it, I was disappointed by Francis's treatment of Spencer's psychology. Until now my main exposure to Spencer's thought was Peter Godfrey-Smith's attempts to rehabilitate Spencer's biologically grounded psychology for contemporary philosophers of mind, many of whom are still mired in the highly abstract analytical tradition (e.g., Godfrey-Smith 1996). This work led me to Spencer's Principles of Psychology (1855), the book that shifted the philosophical study of mind into the realm of organic science writ large, as against the narrowly physiological, and cost Spencer a nervous breakdown. While I think I understand Francis' decision to place Principles of Psychology in the metaphysical/philosophical context, I suspect his feel for Spencer's biological psychology may not be as acute as it is for other areas of his thinking.

Spencer is the first psychologist/philosopher that William James mentions approvingly in his own vastly more influential Principles, after dismissing the 'associationist' schools of Hume, Mills, Bain and the German Herbart along with the "'spiritualistic' theory of scholasticism and common sense" (James 1890, pp. 1-2). James not only favourably contrasts Spencer's approach to "the old-fashioned [presumably Cartesian] 'rational psychology'" because Spencer "takes into account the fact that minds inhabit environments which act on them and on which they in turn react" (James 1890, p. 6), he also invokes Spencer as his precedent for using zoological examples. Although James was distinctly unimpressed when he actually met the Englishman, I am not aware that he ever minimized Spencer's influence on his own approach to psychology. These references are, unfortunately I believe, missing from the book, and James does not appear in the index.

Francis may be correct that "Spencer's evolutionary psychology is not available to be quarried by modern sociobiologists" (p. 186). However, Spencer's recognition that the properties of mind are deeply informed by the requirements of life, such that knowledge generation and intelligence in the human animal have the same basic 'shape' as that of the simplest organism, could not be more relevant today. Indeed, it lies at the heart of recent contemporary work in 'embodied cognition', a parallel which Francis misses although in a later chapter in another context he notes that Spencer "foreshadowed the language of late-twentieth-century literary critics when he wrote of 'an embodied Humanity'" (p. 197). Spencer's assertion that, "The assimilative processes going on in a plant, and the reasoning by which a man of science makes a discovery, alike exhibit the adjustment of inner relations to outer relations" (quoted on p. 197), also predates by more than a century Karl Popper's famous epithet that "from the amoeba to Einstein is just one step", and at a time when far less was known about the shared mechanisms of organic life. It might well be plausible to argue that had Spencer's Principles not been so utterly forgotten by psychology, some of the excesses of both behaviourism and the 'cognitive revolution' could have been avoided.

I also have a minor quibble about the structuring of Part III ("Spencer's biological writings and his philosophy of science"). The first chapter of this section provides an excellent discussion of the differences between Spencer's and Darwin's evolutionary thought (e.g., Spencer emphasized continuity rather than change; the success of species measured in the number of adult life forms, not failure via the winnowing effects of selection; organismic wellbeing instead of reproduction) and how each was influenced by the other (or not), especially how Spencer's views changed under (or resisted) growing scientific support for natural selection. This is not especially clear from the chapter title -- "Goodness, perfection and the shape of living things" -- and an evolutionary philosopher could be forgiven for skipping this section entirely, which would be a shame.

Overall, however, Part III is an extremely welcome addition to the history and philosophy of science in several ways. It elucidates the differences between Spencer's definition of life and those of his precursors and contemporaries, as well as the difficulty of drawing a meaningful boundary between the organic and nonorganic; shows how and why Spencer's early vitalism evolved into a relentlessly anti-teleological stance; and, most relevant to contemporary debates, credits Spencer with anticipating modern scepticism regarding attempts to devise a natural system of classification to replace Linnean taxonomy. Although his own theory of scientific knowledge required him to focus on externalities, Spencer nevertheless "concluded that divisions such as those between species, genera or orders -- and even the great gap between animals and plants -- did not represent anything fundamental" (p.212), a conclusion borne out today with discoveries from comparative genomics.

Part IV ("Politics and ethical sociology") addresses in detail the more well known aspects of Spencer's thought -- his politics, social theory and ethics -- which grew out of his early rejection of Jeremy Bentham's principle of utility and a passionate conviction "that the human species was progressive" (p. 247). The latter would survive into his mature years in a much-attenuated form but the former remained a cornerstone of Spencerian thought. Although much of Spencer's work has lost its relevance, Francis draws from these writings "two non-cosmic legacies that may be of value for humanity at large" today (p. 333). The first is the importance of emotion to human (and animal) thriving such that progress should be measured not in aggregate happiness, as utilitarians would have it, but in the banishment of pain, the imposition of which Spencer thought was never justified "in either psychological or political governance" (p. 335). His second legacy, related to the elevation of emotion, was a style of ethical liberalism that "avoided both individualism and choice-making" via a "corporate doctrine stressing the need to protect private lives even if, as was likely, these served no observable public function." Private lives were worth protecting simply by virtue of the fact that they are repositories of emotions, which Spencer saw as "socialized responses possessing the same moral standing as reason," thanks to evolution (p. 334). The monarchical 'will', long philosophically aligned with reason and "whose awakening romantic nationalists had taken to be the beginning of modernity" was, in Spencer's prescient view, an "outmoded psychological concept, whose recapitulation would lead to unnecessary conflict" (p. 334).

This review should be regarded as but the barest taste of the meaty feast Francis provides in this book. The promotional material from the publisher makes much of the fact that this is the first major study of Spencer in thirty years, which "no scholar of nineteenth-century thought can afford to neglect". By contrast, I think there is much of interest here for any reader, scholarly or general, who wishes to understand -- from the Anglophone perspective, at least  -- how we got here. This book deserves a wide audience, wider certainly than it is likely to have simply because it is about Herbert Spencer.


Godfrey-Smith, Peter (1996) Complexity and the Function of Mind in Nature, Cambridge, Cambridge University Press.

James, William (1890) Principles of Psychology, Volume One, New York, Dover Publications (1950 reprint edition).