Historical Judgement: The Limits of Historiographical Choice

Placeholder book cover

Jonathan Gorman, Historical Judgement: The Limits of Historiographical Choice, Acumen, 2007, 258pp., $27.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781844651108

Reviewed by Paul A. Roth, University of California, Santa Cruz


Jonathan Gorman's subtitle signals the thesis that he seeks to establish: to show false postmodernist claims (at least as Gorman reads them) that there exists "unlimited freedom of choice in the context of what to believe about reality." (9) Gorman opposes those forms of postmodernism that extend skepticism about reality to the most basic level of what to count as "atomic" statements of fact. But Gorman develops his account of important constraints on historiographical choice based on assumptions, e.g., holism and anti-realism, that he takes himself to share with the postmodernists he criticizes. This approach distinguishes Gorman's book from many other critiques of postmodernism. Based on the shared assumptions, he develops and defends a type of Quinean position he terms "pragmatic holistic empiricism." (10) Thus, even postmodernists would have to acknowledge his proposed limits on historiographical choices.

The most fundamental argument that Gorman deploys in this regard I term his Davidsonian view of belief and language. It attempts to rule out the very possibility of basic factual disputes by appeal to what a shared language presupposes since Gorman insists that postmodernists must share with others standards of consistency.

The postmodernist thus relies on, that is needs the possibility of, conflict or inconsistency in the way we count reality in order to express the position. But once standards for judging consistency and inconsistency are available, the holistic empiricist position overcomes this approach. (186)

Without such a standard, disagreements could not be identified and articulated.

But given that people share standards of consistency,

it is a requirement rather than a contingency that we share with others some view that provides an initial prefiguring of reality so that we can share our subject matter, and it is a requirement rather than a contingency that we share a recognition of what we would count as conflicting ways of counting or conceptualizing that shared reality. (187)

The level of what must be shared Gorman identifies as a basic level of "atomic sentences." "With regard to the use of language to share reality at the atomic level, it is characteristic for all of us, historians included, to share these things." (186) That which speakers must share, Gorman maintains, suffices to rule out postmodern/skeptical worries that large scale irresolvable disagreements can plausibly reach the level of atomic facts. This limits historiographical choices.

The book has five chapters, the first of which Gorman uses to outline in detail how the argument unfolds in Chapters 2-5. Although the book offers a sustained argument for a particular position, Gorman's real audience consists of those who already share (as I largely do) his contentious assumptions regarding the metaphysics and epistemology of historical knowledge. Those not already inclined to, e.g., anti-realism, will not find anything in this book to persuade them.

Chapter 2 tries to delineate a "model" of historiography faithful to how historians conceive the purpose and problems of their discipline. Although important for his argument, the notion of a model never receives much clarification. Gorman does note that to "speak of a 'model' here is not … to speak of something with technical features; we need not think of it at this stage as being any more than a linguistic entity that says something 'true' about the matter being modeled." (27) But the bare requirement that it be a "linguistic entity" suffices to establish that it cannot do the work that Gorman requires of it, or so I argue below. In any case, Gorman develops a two-tiered analysis of modeling. The first tier asks for an account of what makes for the truth of any assertion in a specific realm of inquiry, e.g., science or history. At this level, a model models a set of norms that guide practices. But disciplines allow more than one model. (Gorman uses the example of Hempel's and Popper's competing models of scientific inquiry.) A second tier of inquiry, then, asks for reasons to prefer one set of normative prescriptions to another.

Gorman rejects the suggestion that there can be an argument for preferring one set of norms to another. So one cannot prove that one model of inquiry ought to be rationally preferred to all others. But here he broaches his core Davidsonian constraint on models of historiography. Even absent any meta-justification of a particular model, an important constraint on choice of models remains. For, he insists,

historiography is paradigmatically a complex and advanced application of such everyday understanding to the everyday world, conceiving that as extending into the past… . [O]ur 'scientific' world still has to be continuous with the everyday world, if only for the purposes of communication. Our philosophy of historiography presupposes this. (25)

Call this required agreement about a shared everyday world that must extend into and inform more specialized inquiries the "continuity condition." This holds, Gorman maintains, even in the absence of any other meta-justification for choice among models.

Chapter 3 asks how to understand historiography in light of Chapter 2’s argument for a continuity condition. Gorman’s primary effort here involves identifying those issues that, from a perspective provided by the history of historiography, capture the shared activities of historians. "[W]e want our philosophical model of historiography to reflect truthfully what historians 'actually do.' We have thus proposed a historiography of historiography to recover the self-understanding that we judge to be involved here." (98) Having declared that self-understanding incorporates the continuity condition, Gorman announces that it also holds ahistorically. "We have held that historiographical recovery is continuous with everyday recovery, and one implication of this is that there is no specification or limitation of just how far back in time the historiography of historiography ought to go." (103) As evidence, he finds the continuity condition operating in, e.g., Herodotus. (119)

From having identified the continuity condition as the pervasive constraint on the self-understanding of historians qua historians in Chapter 3, Gorman turns to articulating a view he terms "pragmatic holistic empiricism" (10) in Chapter 4. He does this by contrasting Hume's empiricism with Quine's. But he only considers Quine's "Two Dogmas of Empiricism". Gorman uses this sliver of the Quinean corpus to underwrites the key point he wants to make.

This pragmatic approach in which we share an understanding of the need to avoid or overcome conflict gives us sufficient shared standards of consistency to drive our earlier conclusion: that the requirement for a holistic resolution of conflict makes many factual beliefs pragmatically indubitable. (163; see also 156, 185)

But, since Gorman only addresses those already strongly inclined to accept his philosophical premises, his discussion could have been much abbreviated if he had simply indicated that he subscribes to a position for which Davidson famously argues in "The Very Idea of a Conceptual Scheme."

Chapter 5 explores how the continuity condition constrains historical debates even while conceding a good deal to postmodernist critiques. Gorman claims that historical judgment must be limited at the most basic level by a need to agree on atomic sentences. Atomic sentences, Gorman writes, "could be true or false independently of the truth or falsity of the other(s)… . [T]hese sentences are philosophically important because they are crucial to the expression of historical truth." (170-1) Gorman cannot allow inconsistency at the level of what he takes to be 'atomic' sentences -- simple, descriptive ones -- due to his Davidsonian argument that rational historical disagreement presupposes, and so requires, agreement on most basic truths.

Throughout this book we have philosophically characterized historiography in terms of pragmatic choices. We have also argued for the limitations of such choices: in many factual matters alternatives are not in practice available, so making determinate the factual decision. (205-6)

Gorman offers as the mark of the atomic sentence that their truth value can be ascertained 'independently' of other sentences. Although a deeply unQuinean and unDavidsonian assertion, Gorman's argument turns out to (fatally) rely on it.

Gorman will allow, compatible with his view on atomic sentences, inconsistency or incompatibility of views at what he calls the "whole account level." "[T]he factuality of a whole historiographical account could not be understood as wholly reducible to the factuality of its constituent sentences." (202) At this level, views about reality can come apart. Thus, to use an example that Gorman discusses, historians might hold inconsistent or incompatible accounts of Bacon's rebellion. But this does not entail that these accounts must also be inconsistent at the level of "atomic facts." To allow this would be to lose the core constraint Gorman defends as a limit on historical judgment.

But even Quinean observation sentences crucially differ from Gorman's atomic sentences since Gorman attributes to atomic sentences a referential/factual import that Quine denies to observation sentences. Moreover, any sentence presented as atomic rests on others for its meaning and its evidence. This simply follows from what Gorman takes from Quine.

Gorman could fall back on his Davidsonian claim that we must agree. "Our shared language, operating successfully as it does at the short sentence level, involves this contingent commitment to a shared consistent reality." (185) But reference to "short sentences" hardly helps. In the example of conflicting accounts of Bacon's rebellion, Gorman writes, "Plainly in Wertenbaker saying 'Bacon is a hero' and a sentence in Washburn saying 'Bacon is not a hero' would yield inconsistency at the level of the atomic sentence. But that is not the situation." (179-80) Why? Because, Gorman asserts, these statements represent a type of "summary of the whole of the relevant passage." (180) In this respect, "every sentence in [the whole group truth] can be examined for truth, and will pass that atomic test." (180-1) But "Grass is green" also implicitly summarizes much else that had to be learned. So Gorman embraces but in no way mitigates or solves standing philosophical problems here.

The foregoing identifies the deeply philosophically problematic aspect of Gorman's attempts to utilize the continuity condition as he does, viz., how to identify the reach of continuity. The continuity condition constrains judgment, or so Gorman claims, by logically mandating certain types of agreement. Gorman uses Kuhn (in Ch. 2) to resist Hempelian and Popperian mandates regarding the norms of science. But Kuhn's claim regarding the incommensurability of theories receives no mention in Gorman's text. This cannot be an accident, since Kuhn's views on this point were a central target of Davidson's critique, the very critique that argued for belief continuity as a necessary condition of identifying people as speakers of a language at all. So while Gorman does allow for incommensurability at some levels, he requires the root commensurability of "ordinary" discourse. Davidson argues for this in terms of conditions on interpretation. Gorman, I show, requires more.

Neither Quine nor Kuhn allow that a framework exists in which second level justificatory questions can sensibly be raised. Quine's holism, in this regard, chimes well with Kuhnian historiography. This comes as no surprise, since Kuhn very explicitly and openly acknowledges his debt to Quine. But with respect to questioning frameworks or models, Quine goes an important step further, a step occluded by Gorman's underspecification of 'model.' Against Carnap, Quine consistently and from early on (e.g., in "Truth By Convention") maintains that talk of frameworks cannot offer epistemological insight. What to call 'analytic' and what to call 'synthetic,' what to call 'factual' and what to call 'theoretical' only mark decisions for particular purposes because such linguistic decisions must remain parasitic on pre-formalized or pre-theorized understandings.

Gorman accepts this.

In parallel with Kuhn's historiography of science, and like any historian, we have to choose how to write that historiography, choose which questions to ask, choose what count as answers to our questions and deliberate about what the facts are. We will inevitably make assumptions of a quasi-philosophical or at least a prescriptive kind in the choices we make, and the 'facts' we produce will be at least partially a product of those assumptions. What we get out will be, at least in part, a function of what we put in… . Our selection of approach will depend, among other things, on the questions we seek to answer." (87)

But Gorman turns unQuinean (and unDavidsonian) when he attempts to read the continuity condition as licensing the inference that people must share a framework at some level. Davidson explicitly denies this consequence, arguing only that we have no choice but to interpret people as if they do. Quine's critique of Carnap denies the intelligibility of marking off any such ordinary frameworks of belief at all. For Quine, nothing licenses the assumption that frameworks are anything but ex post facto constructions. Gorman's argument presupposes exactly what Quine took great pains to deny, viz., that it makes any sense to impute the existence of some prior "shared framework" for ordinary language.

Given the role that Gorman wants shared atomic beliefs to play, this would require his establishing that sharedness resides at the level of sameness of sentential belief and not, for example, just in an inclination to mouth 'yes' or 'no' in response to certain marks or sounds. Following Quine, shared meaning can only be made sense of as an artifact of translation and not as the recovery of something prior to it. Following Davidson, shared meaning results from constraints necessary for interpretation. But neither provides for some atomic/non-atomic distinction in the form Gorman uses. So contra Gorman, the continuity condition licenses no such conclusion. It thus remains an open question at what levels views about reality may come apart.

Now it might be thought that Gorman deserves credit at least for bringing these philosophical issues to the historiographical table. It would be nice to report that Gorman's book does, in smaller compass and with less detail, what John Zammito's A Nice Derangement of Epistemes does so well with regard to surveying and assessing the postmodernist and sociological challenges to the philosophy of science. But the book does nothing of the sort. Indeed, puzzles abound regarding why Gorman chooses to examine the figures he does. Although the bibliography cites any number of books and papers of more recent vintage, the positions examined typically date back to work decades old, and then to very selective bits at that. Moreover, if one looks at almost any recent number of History and Theory (or indeed at a 1998 collection put together by some of the editors of that journal -- History and Theory: Contemporary Readings, ed. B. Fay, P. Pomper, and R. Vann) one finds discussions of the issues Gorman canvasses. But, although Gorman belongs to the editorial board of that very journal, he analyzes none of this.

The temptation arises to read Gorman as editorializing, implicitly bemoaning the fact that philosophy of history has stagnated for so long. But he never explicitly argues that. In the end, this book has no audience. For those unfamiliar with the philosophy of history, it offers no helpful survey. For those familiar with the field, what it covers will be hopelessly dated.