History of Chinese Philosophy

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Bo Mou (ed.), History of Chinese Philosophy, Routledge, 2009, 614pp., $225.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415356886.

Reviewed by Ruiping Fan, City University of Hong Kong, and Erika Yu, City University of Hong Kong


History of Chinese Philosophy, is a welcome addition to the literature on Chinese philosophy. Built on works of predecessors who were devoted to investigating whether traditional Chinese thinkers engaged in philosophical inquiries like their Western counterparts, this volume endeavors to enhance our understanding of the major stages of Chinese philosophical development and the place of Chinese philosophy in the common philosophical enterprise. Its primary objective is not simply to outline a historical development of various Chinese schools of thought or to introduce their major tenets, but to address their particular philosophical concerns and examine their implications by emphasizing the method of reflective interpretation and comparative study.

In addition to Bo Mou's 40-page Introduction presenting "the editor's view on the issue [of the methodological dimension of this volume], rather than a survey of others' views" (p.35), it consists of five sections: Identity of Chinese Philosophy; Classical Chinese Philosophy: Pre-Han Period; Classical Chinese Philosophy: From Han through Tang; Classical Chinese Philosophy: Pre-Song through early Qing; and Modern Chinese Philosophy: From Late Qing through the twenty-first century. It has eighteen chapters, contributed by sixteen different authors. This review will provide a general overview of each chapter before addressing a couple of methodological weaknesses from which, in our view, the volume as a whole suffers.

In his Introduction, Mou sets forth two methodological emphases for the volume. The first is what he calls the "reflective-interpretation-concerned orientation," which emphasizes the philosophical interpretation and elaboration of a Chinese thinker's ideas by using conceptual and explanatory resources that may or may not have been adopted by the thinker himself. A key justification of this orientation, Mou argues, is that it could allow us to gain a better understanding of a thinker's ideas by exposing subtle implications that are not explicitly articulated in the texts themselves. The second emphasis is the "philosophical-issue-engagement orientation," which typically entails identifying a philosophically significant issue from a source account or tradition, then allowing its philosophical perspective on the issue to engage with those found in other accounts or traditions. In Mou's view, such engagement is valuable not only because it can accentuate the distinctive contributions of a thinker's ideas to the common philosophical enterprise, but also because it may help different accounts and traditions to develop new approaches to philosophical issues by assimilating their perspectives.

The first section reprints a slightly adjusted version of an article authored by the late philosopher Antonio S. Cua (1932-2007). Originally published in 2000, the article provides an excellent inquiry into "the constructive challenge of Western philosophy to the development of the history of Chinese philosophy" in the 20th century (p.43). Cua's discussion focuses on the methodological aspects of three major works on the history of Chinese philosophy: the pioneering work by Hu Shih, that appeared in 1919; Fung Yu-lan's two-volume book that was published in the 1930s (which is the only one of the three with an English version translated by Derk Boddie); and Lao Sze-kwang's work that was completed and published in 1982. According to Cua, although Fung's work provides much more intellectual material and discusses a much longer history than Hu's work, they share similar judgments regarding the philosophical significance of ancient Chinese thought. Indeed, both men received their doctoral degrees from Columbia University and attempted to reconstruct a history of Chinese philosophy in light of the contemporary movements of experimentalism and pragmatism (p.51). Comparatively, Lao's work is more philosophically sophisticated, addressed to an audience familiar with works of Western philosophy published since 1930. However, Cua argues that it is hardly fair-minded for Lao to criticize the works of Hu and Fung as lacking sufficient philosophical elements. The truth of the matter is that Lao mistakenly regards his audience as a universal audience, an assumption shared by most Western philosophers since Plato (p.59). From Cua's point of view, the shift of focus between Hu's and Fung's works on one hand and Lao's work on the other is in large part a result of the prevailing philosophical movements within which Hu, Fung, and Lao found themselves at their respective times. This is especially evident in the extent to which they were informed by the resources of their respectively favorite Western counterparts (p.60).

The long section covering the pre-Han period begins with Chung-ying Cheng's discussion of how the Chinese yin-yang way of thinking originated in the classic of the Yi-Jing. Having explained the general ideas of the classic and reviewed how various prominent schools of thought have shaped particular understandings of the Yi philosophy, Cheng criticizes the Xiang-Shu approach to the Yi-Jing as undermining the significance of reflective response in interpreting divination. He concludes that any new approach that explores the Yi philosophy must appreciate the value of human agency in understanding and partaking in the process of creative changes of reality. In the next chapter, Edward Slingerland highlights the religious underpinning of Confucius' teachings. He contends that while it is well-known that Confucius considers ritual practice crucial for moral cultivation, his effort to restore the Zhou ritual system describes an essentially religious duty. It is rooted in Confucius' religious faith that the Way of Zhou is in accord with the Will of Heaven and that sincere practitioners will be infused with virtue to live well since they have properly related themselves to both the cosmos and each other under the Will of Heaven. In his contribution, "The Mohist School", Chris Fraser reviews the major ideas of Mo Zi and his followers on politics, ethics, epistemology, philosophy of language and logic. He argues that although the once influential Mohist School has never attained the orthodox position that Confucianism or Daoism enjoyed, Mo Zi and his followers were actually the originators of philosophical argumentation in those areas in China.

The next chapter is Yiu-ming Fung's discussion of the School of Names. Having pointed out that this School's thinkers are often characterized as Chinese sophists, Fung aims to examine whether their theses could be placed within Quine's classification of paradoxes. While Fung finds the absence of antinomy, he holds that some texts could be interpreted as veridical or falsidical paradoxes. In his view, the Chinese sophists differ from their Western counterparts because they do not formalize their theses with a logical structure. Kim-chong Chong's contribution examines the seemingly opposing views of Mencius and Xun Zi on human nature (xing). According to his analysis, Mencius and Xun Zi conceptualize xing in rather different senses. Xun Zi fundamentally disagrees with Mencius' claim that xing consists of an inherent sense. Against the common reading that Xun Zi upholds xing as bad, Chong argues that Xun Zi actually holds that xing is morally neutral.

The section closes with two chapters on the Daoists Lao Zi and Zhuang Zi respectively. Given that interpretation of the Dao-De-Jing has been highly contentious, Xiaogan Liu surveys different accounts of the authorship and dating of the text as well as the concept of Dao. Liu proposes that the best way to resolve such disputes is to closely examine the text in its linguistic, social, and historical contexts. Upon such examination, he sets out to defend Sima Qian's view on the authorship and dating and challenges any attempt to precisely define Dao. In contrast, Vincent Shen's discussion of the Zhuang Zi accentuates the importance of the spiritual life and the pursuit of freedom in union with the Dao in Zhuang Zi's philosophy. Shen first points out that for Zhuang Zi, vis-à-vis Hui Shi, the famous sophist, mere formal and logical argumentation is not only of limited philosophical value, but also may induce one to become obsessed with external things and lose self-understanding. Hence, it may obstruct the pursuit of truth and the union with the Dao. In Shen's view, Zhuang Zi is a transcendental and ontological philosopher.

Yiu-ming Fung begins the next section with an overview of Chinese philosophy in the Han Dynasty. His discussion focuses on how the thoughts of HuaiNanZi's authors, Dong Zhongshu and Wang Chong, were shaped by the framework of Yin-yang and Wu-xing that was prominent at the time. Fung argues that HuaiNanZi's authors assimilated Yin-yang and Wu-xing ideas to develop their qi-cosmology. Dong proposed a correspondence and resonance between Heaven and human, and Wang developed a naturalistic philosophy. In addition, Alan Chan's chapter addresses the Neo-Daoist movement of xuan-xue ("dark learning") in which Classical Daoism faced substantial re-interpretations. Chan shows that as a result of their divergent ontological views concerning the relation between Dao and the origin of beings, the Neo-Daoists advocated different political and ethical lives in the quest for Daoist order. Finally, in reviewing Chinese Buddhist philosophy in this period, Whalen Lai addresses the rise of what he calls "Sinitic Mahayana" by expounding on the emergence and key ideas of the text The Awakening of Faith in Mahayana. Lai avers that Sinitic Mahayana is a creative synthesis resulting from reciprocal exchanges between the teachings of Indian Mahayana and Chinese thoughts, especially those advanced by Daoism.

Liu Shu-hsien begins the section that covers Song to early Qing philosophy with two chapters on Neo-Confucianism. The first chapter discusses the trend of Cheng-Zhuli-xue (learning of principle). Liu highlights that what distinguishes the teachings of Cheng Yi and Zhu Xi is their emphasis and shared view on the dualism of li (principle) and qi (material force). They held that the movement of dynamic qi in accordance with the eternal li is fundamental to the formation of an orderly universe. Seeing that our transcendent nature and empirical feelings are parallel to li and qi, Zhu Xi further advanced the view that personal pursuit of humanity (ren) should entail our mind actively seeking the knowledge of our nature and aligning our feelings with ren. The subsequent chapter addresses Lu-Wang xin-xue (learning of heart-mind), which is marked by the monism of xin (heart-mind) and the principle of nature. In contrast with Cheng and Zhu, Lu Jiuyuan and Wang Yangming advocated the simple, easy, and direct method of recovering one's good nature by manifesting the original mind. For them, the mind should not seek the principle outside itself. The principle is nothing but the innate knowledge of the mind which is the same as the original substance of the heavenly mind. Accordingly, personal pursuit of humanity requires individual effort to recover the original substance of one's heart-mind. Finally, Cheng Chung-yi closes this section with a lengthy chapter on Confucian intellectual development from the late Ming through early Qing period. Cheng attributes the decline of Song-Ming Confucianism to Wang Ji and the Taizhou School's misinterpretations of Wang Yangming's teachings. He also explains why later efforts from both xin-xue and li-xue scholars to rescue their respective schools failed. Cheng considers that it was only with Dai Zhen that a new approach to Confucian philosophy was eventually developed.

Xinjan Jiang opens the final section covering Late Qing through the twenty-first century by discussing the major ideas of what she calls "five Chinese enlightenment thinkers" -- Yan Fu, Liang Qichao, Wang Guowei, Hu Shih, and Zhang Dongsun. Jiang acknowledges their contributions by highlighting how their exposure to Western views leads them to criticize and modernize Chinese traditions by connecting Western ideas with the Chinese situation. In the next chapter, Chenshan Tian examines how Marxism develops its distinctive form in China. He argues that under the influence of yin-yang way of thinking rooted in the Yi philosophy, the "Marxist dialectics" acquired its Chinese meaning articulated as bian-zheng-fa, which inherits elements of tong-bian (continuity through change) and as a result becomes rather different from the Marxist sense of dialectics. Sor-hoon Tan's chapter discusses the development of contemporary Neo-Confucianism through the efforts of Xiong Shili, Tang Junyi, and Mou Zongsan. Inspired and challenged by Western theories, especially German Idealism, these philosophers, Tan observes, shared the endeavor to revive Confucianism by reconstructing Confucian metaphysical resources based on Song-Ming study of heart-mind and nature as well as their implications for contemporary society. In the final chapter, Bo Mou returns to address the movement of constructive engagement between Chinese and Western philosophies in recent years. By reviewing the purposes, development, and achievements of this engagement, Mou further justifies the two methodological emphases he puts forth in the Introduction.

Taken together, we find it difficult to measure the extent to which the two methodological orientations -- the "reflective-interpretation-concerned orientation" and the "philosophical-issue-engagement orientation" -- have been employed in these chapters to produce a volume on the history of Chinese philosophy. The difficulty is not so much that individual chapters variously emphasize the two methodologies. It is rather a question of how we should evaluate the volume as a coherent whole. To be sure, the contributors have admirably made good use of both primary and secondary texts to build their cases. They are engaged in serious comparison and evaluation of the relevant accounts that have been developed by their predecessors or peers that addresses the "philosophical" issues they have selected. At the same time, wherever required, they also carefully reread original texts, expound their own understandings and do their own translations. As a result, the book provides a succinct overview of how the major Chinese philosophical systems emerge, compete with their rivals, and evolve in order to meet the theoretical and practical challenges they face. Many chapters may count as original in the sense that they are not a mere summary of what has been studied. They offer erudite arguments that stimulate further understanding of a series of Chinese philosophical issues. In these senses, the volume is certainly "reflective" and "philosophical-issue-engaged."

On the other hand the two methodological orientations have not been well served in the volume as a whole. Evidently, the contributors confront two challenges in striking a balance in making their cases. First, they need to survey the background information regarding their subjects in order to set out s context sufficient to justify the philosophical issues on which they have chosen to focus, while this general presentation should not detract from their primary philosophical examination and reflection. This challenge seems to have been roughly met by the contributors. However, there is another challenge that does not seem fully met. The challenge is this. The philosophical issues that the author has picked out of a Chinese school of thought to become the focus of a chapter depend on the general philosophical perspective, knowledge scope, intellectual interests, evaluation criteria, as well as academic taste of that author. Given that these factors vary from author to author, the book lacks a continuity of focus (in terms of either a configuration of philosophical issues or an angle of philosophical reflection). For example, in Chapter 5 Chong provides a thought-provoking reflection on the classical debate about human nature between Mencius and Xun Zi, but in Chapters 12 and 13 the issue is totally out of sight when Liu addresses the Neo-Confucianism in Song and Ming. Throughout the volume, it seems that no balance of focus has been made between one chapter and others relevant to it. Perhaps this challenge has no way of being met by any volume with a group of independent philosophical authors, even if each chapter, as in this volume, stands firmly as a philosophical essay in its own right.

Moreover, the "reflective" methodology seen throughout the chapters seems to remain very much a one-way reflection on Chinese philosophy from a Western perspective. Various Western philosophical perspectives, theories, ideas, concepts, and methods are adopted to handle Chinese philosophical materials or issues from case to case, chapter to chapter. But it is not easy to find any significant reflection on Western philosophy from a Chinese philosophical perspective in the volume. In this regard, the book's authors do not distinguish themselves from their predecessors. While Hu Shih and Fung Yu-lan appealed to American pragmatist views to reconstruct Chinese classics into Chinese philosophy and Lao Sze-kwang adopted Kantian and Hegelian rationalism to analyze and resolve Chinese problems, the authors of this volume draw on much more rich and diverse Western philosophical ideas to do their work. However, their work is still going in the same, one-way direction.

Given the admirable aim of "engaging Chinese philosophy with its Western counterpart constructively for the common philosophical enterprise," readers cannot help but ask: where is the contribution of Chinese philosophy to "the common philosophical enterprise" in this volume? Indeed, its readers are most likely to be those more familiar with Western philosophy, as the editor notes, and this raises the concern: to what extent would such readers be able to identify the relevance of the resources provided by the Chinese philosophy it presents? What is the evidence that we might fix a Western philosophical problem by appealing to a Chinese philosophical view? Which concept is required from Chinese philosophy to shed light on a Western philosophical perspective? And where is the clue to improve a Western philosophical theory by drawing on Chinese resources? As excellent a philosophical editor as Bo Mou is, we hope that he will emphasize and implement a genuinely two-way reflection methodology in his future work.