Hobbes and Republican Liberty

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Quentin Skinner, Hobbes and Republican Liberty, Cambridge University Press, 2008, 245pp., $22.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521714167.

Reviewed by Bernard Gert, Dartmouth College


In this book Quentin Skinner contrasts two rival theories about the nature of human liberty. The first, which he traces back to antiquity, is now called republican liberty. It asserts, "freedom within civil associations is subverted by the mere presence of arbitrary power." (p. X) "One crucial implication is that liberty can be lost or forfeited even in the absence of any acts of interference." (p. XII) Skinner contrasts this account of liberty with the definition of liberty with which Hobbes begins Chapter XXI of Leviathan,

Liberty, or freedome, signifieth (properly) the absence of Opposition; (by Opposition, I mean externall Impediments of motion;) and may be applyed no lesse to Irrationall and Inanimate creatures, than to Rationall. For whatsoever is so tyed, or environed, as it cannot move, but within a certain space, which space is determined by the opposition of some externall body, we say it hath not Liberty to go further.

According to Skinner, Hobbes holds that citizens have liberty insofar as they are not physically prevented from acting as they would like.

Reading this book made clear to me how different the fields of history, even intellectual history, and philosophy, especially analytic philosophy, are. Over thirty years ago I helped to translate chapters X-XV of De Homine, (1658) which together with the contemporary (1651) translation of De cive, and my thirty-page introduction, were published in a volume entitled Man and Citizen. I have written many articles on Hobbes including several for standard reference works in philosophy, yet in reading Quentin Skinner's book, Hobbes and Republican Liberty, I learned how little I knew about Hobbes, especially the possible historical influences on his work. I had been intrigued by the frontispieces of both De cive and Leviathan, but had never realized that the idea of frontispieces for philosophical works had become popular about 100 years before Hobbes' translation of Thucydides, which also had "a spectacular emblematic frontispiece in which an attempt is made to represent some of the leading themes in Thucydides' narrative." (p. 7) Although I visited Chatsworth about forty years ago, I was completely unaware that the library contained "some well-known examples of this burgeoning genre" (p. 9) of "emblemata or emblem-books." This is only one example of my ignorance about the possible historical influences on Hobbes.

Skinner devotes more than a third of his book to discussing The Elements of Law, Naturall and Politique. I view the relationship between The Elements and De cive as similar to that between Wittgenstein's Blue and Brown Books and the Philosophical Investigations. Insofar as the views expressed in the earlier and later books are the same, this shows that the philosopher continued to hold the position that he had initially stated, but insofar as the views expressed in the earlier and later books are different, that means that he had given up the earlier position. (Please excuse my stating this obvious and trivial point.) I am interested in the correctness of Hobbes' considered and mature moral and political theories, so I am not concerned with the views that he had abandoned before officially publishing them.

In the course of presenting his view about Hobbes' concept of liberty, Skinner also brings in Hobbes' analysis of free-will, where Hobbes says, "from the use of the word free-will no liberty can be inferred of the will, desire, or inclination, but the liberty of the man, which consisteth in this: that he finds no stop in doing what he has the will, desire, or inclination to do." (Leviathan, XXI, 2) Because of the similarity between what Hobbes says about free-will and what he says about liberty, Skinner seems to take Hobbes' analysis of what is meant by free-will to be directly relevant to what Hobbes means when he talks of the liberty of subjects.

Skinner points out that in The Elements Hobbes "implicitly repudiates the entire scholastic understanding of the will as one of the permanent faculties of the human soul, the faculty that enables us freely to will and thereby freely to act." (p. 25) Hobbes explicitly repudiates this scholastic understanding of the will because such an understanding is incompatible with his life-long determinism and materialism. Hobbes makes the identical point in De Homine, "Whenever we say that someone hath free-will to do this or that, or not to do it, it must be understood with this necessary condition: if he wills. For to talk of having free-will to do this or that whether one wills or not is absurd." (D.H., XI, 2) Hobbes' discussion of free-will is related to what he calls voluntary actions; it is not directly related to his discussion of that liberty that is relevant to his political theory.

Skinner also points out that Hobbes' account of free-will also goes against "One of the almost unquestioned assumptions of his age … that genuinely free agents are invariably moved to act by reason as opposed to passion or appetite." (pp. 26-27) Hobbes says, "The definition of the will given commonly by the Schools that it is a rational appetite, is not good. For if it were then could there be no voluntary act against reason." (Leviathan, VI, 53) He prefers his definition of will as, "the last appetite or aversion, immediately adhering to the action or to the omission thereof." While many contemporary philosophers agree with Hobbes that there is no faculty of willing, they do not accept his view that any action based on any passion or appetite is a voluntary one. It is now generally held that some appetites are the symptoms of a mental disorder, and that acting on these appetites does not count as voluntary action.

Skinner claims, and I agree, that there are some significant changes in Hobbes's views between The Elements and his later published works. With regard to his views on human nature, I contrast what Hobbes wrote in Human Nature (the first part of The Elements) to what he wrote in De Homine. It is only in that early work that the claim that Hobbes holds psychological egoism is plausible, while no one reading De Homine would claim that Hobbes held such a view. I argue that Hobbes' major works on moral and political theory, De cive and Leviathan, should be interpreted in light of this later work, not the earlier work. I also agree with Skinner that there is a difference between Hobbes' definition of liberty in The Elements and De cive and in Leviathan, but it is not clear that this involves any significant philosophical change in his political theory.

In De cive, although Hobbes talks about the three ways in which liberty can be given up or taken away, (D.C. XV, 7) he does not explicitly use the term "liberty" when he defines The Right of Nature. It is not until Leviathan that Hobbes explicitly uses "liberty" in that definition.

THE RIGHT OF NATURE … is the liberty each man hath to use his own power, as he will himself, for the preservation of his own nature, that is to say, of his own life, and consequently of doing anything which, in his own judgment and reason, he shall conceive to be the aptest means thereunto. (Leviathan, XIV, 1)

In the next paragraph, Hobbes explicitly defines liberty.

By Liberty is understood, according to the proper signification of the word, the absence of external impediments, which impediments may often take away part of a man's power to do what he would, but cannot hinder him from using the power left him, according as his judgment and reason shall dictate to him. (Leviathan, XIV, 2)

It is that liberty which is related to right of nature that is the liberty that is central to Hobbes' political theory. Thus it is remarkable that although Skinner does talk about the right of nature in the chapter, "Liberty and Political Obligation," he continues to hold that when Hobbes talks about the liberty of citizens he is talking about the liberty of bodies and "cannot be speaking of anything other than the absence of external impediments that render movement impossible." (p. 208)

Not only does Skinner not appreciate that the liberty of subjects is that liberty that is related to the right of nature, but also he does not appreciate the importance of the law of nature in clarifying what Hobbes means by the liberty of citizens. The contrast Hobbes draws between right and law clarifies what he means by liberty,

they [right and law] ought to be distinguished, because RIGHT consisteth in liberty to do or to forbear, whereas Law determineth and bindeth to one of them, so that law and right differ as much as obligation and liberty, which in one and the same matter are inconsistent. (Leviathan, XIV, 3; see also Leviathan, XXVI, 44)

In De cive Hobbes also contrasts liberty with obligation, and after mentioning the "obligation that arises from contract," he talks about "two species of natural obligation," by which "liberty is taken away." (De cive, XV, 7) It may be an indication of how little Skinner thinks that the right of nature, the law of nature, and obligation have to do with Hobbes' account of liberty, that there is no entry in the index for any of these three.

Skinner is correct that it is in Leviathan that Hobbes makes clear that obligation is the result of external impediments. For example, in De cive, XV, 7, Hobbes attempts to explain our obligation to obey God. When he talks about the "liberty that is taken away by corporal impediments," he continues, "according to which we say that heaven and earth, and all creatures, do obey the common laws of their creation." This way of talking makes it impossible to distinguish between not having liberty and not having power. Confusion is often the result when Hobbes tries to apply his political concepts to God. But in chapter XXXI of Leviathan, which has the same name as chapter XV of De cive, "Of the Kingdom of God by Nature," Hobbes is much clearer and does not talk about our obligation to obey God at all.

Although in his political theory Hobbes almost always contrasts liberty with obligation, when Skinner discusses what he takes to be the important sense of liberty, he contrasts it with corporal impediments not obligation. Together with the fact that Skinner does not recognize that the most important sense of liberty is that which is related to the right of nature at all, this shows that he does not appreciate that the first and most important way liberty is given up is to lay down one's right by means of a contract, covenant, or free gift. Hobbes says, "To lay down a man's right to anything is to divest himself of the liberty of hindering another of the benefit of his own right to the same." (Leviathan, XIV, 6)

In the chapter that Hobbes devotes to the liberty of subjects, he says,

For in the act of our submission consisteth both our obligation and our liberty, which must therefore be inferred by arguments taken from thence, there being no obligation on any man that ariseth not from some act of his own; for all men by nature are equally free. (Leviathan, XXI, 10)

Skinner quotes this passage, but does not seem to think that it represents the most important sense of liberty in Hobbes. The limit to a citizen's obligation, and so the liberty that all citizens have, is set by the limit to what rights a person can give up. Although it is well known that Hobbes says that the right to self-defence is inalienable, that is, nothing can count as giving up that right, it is not generally recognized that Hobbes includes as an inalienable right the right of a person not to accuse himself as well as other rights. (Leviathan, XXI, 13)

Hobbes admits that other liberties of citizens "depend on the silence of the laws. In cases where the sovereign has prescribed no rule, there the subject has liberty to do or forbear, according to his own discretion." (Leviathan, XXI, 18) Further, Hobbes says that the sovereign should make no unnecessary laws, that is, laws that do not further the protection of the commonwealth or the safety of its citizens. Hobbes claims, "the procuration of the safety of the people" is the end of sovereignty, and "by safety here is not meant a bare preservation, but also all other contentments of life, which every man by lawful industry, without danger or hurt to the commonwealth, shall acquire to himself." (Leviathan, XXX, 1) Although, Skinner is correct in pointing out that Hobbes says, "liberty in the proper sense … [is] corporal liberty" (Leviathan, XXI, 6), it is quite clear that this is not the sense of liberty that Hobbes is using when he talks about "the liberty of subjects." Hobbes explicitly says that men have

made artificial chains, called civil laws, which they themselves by mutual covenants have fastened at one end to the lips of that man or assembly to whom they have given the sovereign power, and at the other end to their own ears. These bonds, in their own nature but weak, may nevertheless be made to hold by the danger (though not by the difficulty) of breaking them. (Leviathan, XXI, 5)

Hobbes conceives of laws, which are based on covenants, as external impediments, and he regards them as taking away liberty of citizens.

Skinner seems to think that because Hobbes says that the proper sense of liberty is corporal liberty, that is, the absence of corporal impediments, that when talking about the liberty of subjects Hobbes is talking about this kind of liberty. However, Hobbes explicitly says, "In relations to these bonds only it is that I am to speak now of the liberty of subjects." (Leviathan, XXI, 6) A citizen's liberty is not corporal liberty, but rather liberty from covenants or laws. A citizen is free to do what he wants if there is no law requiring him to do or forbear from that act. It may be that Hobbes was reacting against the account of republican liberty, that is, the absence of an arbitrary power, put forward by many of his contemporaries, but he certainly was not putting forward as an alternative, liberty as the absence of corporal impediments.

As I said in the beginning of this review, Skinner's book presents great amounts of information about Hobbes and his times and about what might have been precedents for Hobbes' account of liberty that will be new to most philosophers. Hobbes may also have come to put forward his account of the liberty of subjects in order to provide an alternative to the republican account of liberty. However, Skinner's view that what Hobbes means by the liberty of citizens or subjects is the absence of corporal impediments cannot be taken as providing a plausible philosophical account of what Hobbes means.