Hobbes on Politics and Religion

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Laurens van Apeldoorn and Robin Douglass (eds.), Hobbes on Politics and Religion, Oxford University Press, 2018, 297pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198803409.

Reviewed by Stewart Duncan, University of Florida


Hobbes's political thought is well known. His discussions of religious issues, such as those in part 3 of Leviathan, tend to attract less attention. But those discussions were clearly of some importance to Hobbes -- thus all the space they occupy in Leviathan -- and interact in complex ways with his political thought. This volume aims to look at those interactions, and at "Hobbes's religious politics, rather than his own religious beliefs, or lack thereof" (4).

In their introduction, the editors quote A. P. Martinich remarking that "most Hobbes scholars are secularists" (4), and noting the consequences of this for the way people write about Hobbes. It's definitely positive to have people writing about the religious aspects of Hobbes's approach, whatever their own position may be. Still, a challenge remains for some secular readers of Hobbes -- at least for this secular reader of Hobbes -- of getting a grasp on what is really at stake in Hobbes's discussions of religious matters. One way in which this volume is useful is in giving a sense of answers to that question.

Though some themes emerge, the fifteen chapters are independent of each other. The contributors come from a variety of disciplinary backgrounds, and address a range of topics, from Calvinism to the church-state relationship to a comparison between Hobbes and Rawls on the notion of an overlapping consensus. Though there may be no substantive overall message or thesis of the volume, the chapters provide a number of interesting and valuable perspectives on Hobbes's thought in this area.

Johan Olsthoorn, in "The Theocratic Leviathan: Hobbes's Arguments for the Identity of Church and State", notes that Hobbes did not just hold the (Erastian) view of the state's authority over the church, but also argued that state and church ("properly understood") are identical (10). Olsthoorn identifies and discusses two arguments for the identity thesis, one in De Cive and one in Leviathan. In both works, Hobbes thought of the members of the state church as being all the citizens of the (properly formed Hobbesian) commonwealth. And in both cases, the formation and gathering of the church involves the proper authority of the sovereign. Still the question arises: why are the church and state identical? The answer in De Cive appears to hinge on an argument about church and state having identical matter (the citizens) and form (the sovereign's authority). In Leviathan, Olsthoorn argues, the explanation depends on the view of representation, or personation, that Hobbes holds there.

Martinich, in "Natural Sovereignty and Omnipotence in Hobbes's Leviathan", considers several aspects of Hobbes's picture of God as a sovereign who is natural and absolute. Hobbes takes God to be sovereign because of his irresistible power rather than, for example, because of his goodness (Leviathan 31.5). There is, as Martinich notes (35), a question here about how Hobbes can attribute omnipotence to God, given other things he says about the extreme limits of our knowledge of God. But in Leviathan at least, Hobbes seems consistently committed to the omnipotence of God. Another apparent conflict is between Hobbes's treatment of God as a natural sovereign and his earlier definition of 'sovereign' (Leviathan 17.13-4). Martinich argues that "Hobbes intended his definition to define only human sovereignty" (40).

Teresa M. Bejan, in "First Impressions: Hobbes on Religion, Education, and the Metaphor of Imprinting", starts by noting those who see a tolerant Hobbes. She then moves to thinking about the extent of outside influence on religious views in Hobbes's system. Obviously, Hobbes has the general idea that you can be compelled to talk and act, but not to believe. But how much influence does he, nevertheless, think the sovereign can have on beliefs? Bejan argues that Hobbes thinks there is a fair amount of such influence, and that this counts against 'tolerant Hobbes' readings. Much of Bejan's argument involves examining Hobbes's use of the metaphor of imprinting, in discussions of education.

Franck Lessay, in "Tolerance as a Dimension of Hobbes's Absolutism", continues the discussion of the 'tolerant Hobbes' theme. Lessay wants to emphasize tolerance more than Bejan does, though the precise disagreement between them is a little tricky to pinpoint. Acknowledging but not completely endorsing Bejan, he indeed grants the possibility that the sovereign will be able to influence subjects' beliefs (69 n23). But it may be important here that Lessay thinks Hobbes "made religious toleration thinkable and practical" (68-9) which is somewhat different from Hobbes having actually endorsed it.

Alexandra Chadwick, in "Hobbes on the Motives of Martyrs", asks how Hobbes's psychology, with its emphasis on self-preservation, might account for the motives of martyrs. She argues -- very plausibly -- that one can reject an over-emphasis on self-preservation, without rejecting "the relevance of Hobbes's mechanistic materialism for his treatment of human nature" (80).

Alan Cromartie, in "Hobbes, Calvinism, and Determinism", argues, to put it simply, that Hobbes was not a Calvinist. Many of Hobbes's religious views are not Calvinist ones (96-7). The one Hobbesian view that seems as if it might be Calvinist, or closely related to Calvinism, is Hobbes's determinism (97-8). Cromartie argues, however, that "that mainstream Calvinism was not deterministic" (104), and Hobbes "revealed a striking ignorance of fairly basic features of their [Calvinists'] theology" (98). Even aside from its considerable insights into Hobbes's work, this paper was tremendously helpful for this secular reader of Hobbes in getting beyond a rather vague sense that seventeenth-century debates about determinism and about predestination had something to do with one another, and moving towards a better understanding of their more complex relationship.

Alison McQueen, in "Mosaic Leviathan: Religion and Rhetoric in Hobbes's Political Thought", considers the importance of the Old Testament and biblical Israel in the political discussions of seventeenth-century England. Within that, she asks why Hobbes tried to use Moses, rather than Davidic kings, as an example of a sovereign. In answer to that, she suggests that Hobbes "appropriates the images and narratives of parliamentarians and republicans and subversively redirects them in service of absolutism" (118).

Paul B. Davis, in "Devil in the Details: Hobbes's Use and Abuse of Scripture", considers Hobbes's use, and modifications, of Biblical editions and translations. In writing particular books, Hobbes tended to stick mostly with one edition or translation: e.g., the Geneva Bible in the Elements of Law, but the Authorized Version in Leviathan (134). Davis explores why Hobbes might have made this shift, but also considers ways in which Hobbes deviated from the Authorized Version in Leviathan. Thus we find, for example, that he modified quotations to use 'Holy Spirit' rather than 'Holy Ghost' in his discussion of the biblical use of 'spirit' in chapter 34 of Leviathan, quietly removing the word with the "more supernatural connotation" (139). This is not the only example -- indeed Davies suggests that Hobbes had a "cavalier attitude to the text of the Bible" (147).

Patricia Springborg, in "The Politics of Hobbes's Historia Ecclesiastica", argues that the Historia "fits into the scheme of Hobbes's works in a hitherto unexplained way, as a missing link between the English and Latin versions of Leviathan" (152). This requires thinking it was written earlier than it might otherwise seem to have been (153). As well as considering the Historia itself, Springborg also provides useful information on other ecclesiastical histories, to show where Hobbes's work fits in and to make an argument about what he was in fact doing: "that Hobbes's poem was intended to appeal to the relative humanism of the Christian historiographers against the rabid sectarianism of the heresiologists of his day" (159).

The late Glen Newey's "A Profile in Cowardice? Hobbes, Personation, and the Trinity" looks at Hobbes's views on personation and the Trinity, with a focus on the Appendix to the Latin edition of Leviathan. It seems plausible that Hobbes, around the time he was working on the Latin Leviathan, was concerned to show he was no heretic, at least from an Anglican perspective. But given that desire, one wonders why Hobbes added the material he did in the Appendix: "why, if Hobbes indeed found himself in a hole because of his unorthodox theological views, did he keep digging" (171)? Consideration of the changes Hobbes made in producing the Latin version leads Newey to argue that Hobbes was not, as some have thought, primarily motivated by avoiding controversy and punishment.

Jon Parkin, in "Hobbes and the Future of Religion", asks what Hobbes thought a Hobbesian religious future would look like. He argues that Hobbes did not aim to advocate one particular future religion, but saw multiple possibilities, and hoped to encourage "a set of Hobbesian background conditions that might play out in a number of different ways in practice" (188). To motivate this, Parkin looks at some early reactions to Hobbes on religion. There was certainly puzzlement, but not so much the later puzzlement about which group Hobbes really belonged to, as a sense of Hobbes's views as wild and incoherent. Parkin suggests, then, that Hobbes was encouraging people with a variety of positions to think in Hobbesian ways as they moved forward (198). He includes some intriguing material about Hobbes's appeal to both Episcopalians and Independents in this regard. I do wonder, however, how we are to reconcile the thought that Hobbes envisioned a future with a variety of forms of Christianity with Hobbes's apparent insistence on having one state church. But perhaps there is room for seeing Hobbes as having multiple goals here -- say, as thinking the ideal situation would involve one state church, but also thinking that there were ways in which the religious situation could be improved that fell short of that ideal.

Elad Carmel, in "Hobbes and Early English Deism", argues "that Hobbes was a significant influence on subsequent deists" (204). Carmel considers the connections between Hobbes's work and that of Blount, Toland, Tindal, and Collins. He also argues directly against Jonathan Israel's thought that Hobbes, given some of his views, could not have been a central influence on radicals such as deists. Carmel's overall story seems to me rather plausible, though Hobbes's influence on some rather un-Hobbesian views remains curious in places. Thus, in Carmel's discussion of Collins (210-2), I'm struck by the way we find Hobbesian anticlericalism together with a rather anti-Hobbesian advocacy of individual freethinking on religious matters. Carmel, indeed, finds Collins invoking Hobbes in support of freethinking, which is in a way a curious position, though one can see how one might arrive at it -- say via the anticlericalism, or by taking Hobbes himself as an example.

Jeffrey Collins, in "All the Wars of Christendom: Hobbes's Theory of Religious Conflict", addresses the "commonplace" that Hobbes was "a modern, secular theorist who helped to resolve the problem of religious warfare" (220). His initial discussion suggests that 'religious war' is not a terribly useful category. Still, Hobbes did think the English civil war was a sort of religious war, and indeed seems to have had two different accounts of it as a religious war, which Collins examines: one account of it as "an uprising of the conscientious'", the other account focused on the role of the established church.

Daniel Eggers takes a rather different approach in "Religious Conflict and Moral Consensus: Hobbes, Rawls, and Two Types of Moral Justification". Eggers describes Hobbes as having a consensualist approach, a "strategy of appealing to a moral consensus that can ground one's political argument in the face of religious pluralism" (240). He seeks to compare Hobbes's version of this approach to Rawls's version (as seen especially, but not only, in Political Liberalism). Hobbes's version offers extra-moral justification -- he "attempts to derive the moral necessity of certain forms of behaviour from wholly non-moral premises" (244). Rawls's version offers an intra-moral justification -- he does not start from such wholly non-moral premises. Having set up this contrast, Eggers explores the advantages and disadvantages of each approach, arguing that, despite having some initial appeal, an extra-moral approach is not more likely to succeed than an intra-moral one.

S. A. Lloyd considers "Hobbes on the Duty Not to Act on Conscience". Hobbes rejects the view that acting against your conscience is sin. Indeed he argues that sometimes you ought to act against your conscience. Lloyd investigates this, and aims by doing so to investigate the extent to which Hobbes's view has religious foundations. She examines several Hobbesian reasons -- epistemic, moral, and scriptural -- against the existence of a duty to act on conscience. Beyond all those reasons, Lloyd also argues that the alternative view creates tragic dilemmas that Hobbes's view avoids, when one is faced with a conflict between sovereign command and the voice of conscience, backed by divine reward and punishment. In the final section, Lloyd asks whether Hobbes's argument "depend[s] essentially on religious premises" (271). This is an interesting issue, though there seem to be two different questions to consider here -- 'how would Hobbes's argument look if it had no religious premises?' and 'how would Hobbes's approach fare if people had no religious motivations?'

Lloyd has, together with Martinich, recently published an open letter in which they "urge scholars to refer to Leviathan with numbers to chapters and paragraphs and/or pages as they occur in an edition of 1651. We urge editors not to require their contributors to include page references to the Clarendon edition".[1] This volume, in contrast, gives references to the English Leviathan by chapter number, followed by page number in Noel Malcolm's Clarendon edition. In considering the issues raised by Lloyd and Martinich, it is helpful to distinguish two questions -- a question about which edition scholars should regard as standard, and a question about the best manner of reference to the text. Here I want just to comment on the second of those questions. Even if one has a standard edition, it is helpful to have a means of reference that is not so tightly bound to that edition that those with other editions can't follow your references. Compare the situation in work on Locke's Essay: Nidditch's edition is standard, but it's common to give references by book, chapter, and section, not by page number in that edition. Now the case of Leviathan is different from that of the Essay, as there's no such a scheme of reference built in to the text. But as Lloyd and Martinich note, there are available options. We can use the page numbers of the 1651 edition, which are provided by many other editions, or a system of chapter and paragraph number (which I admit I prefer myself). Either of those would be more easily followed by more readers than the system used in this volume.

In evaluating the volume overall, though, that is a minor quibble. Given the range and quality of the contributions, I expect that anyone interested in this aspect of Hobbes's philosophy will find something of value here.

[1] TheĀ letter, and several responses, are available on the European Hobbes Society's website.