Hobbes on Resistance: Defying the Leviathan

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Susanne Sreedhar, Hobbes on Resistance: Defying the Leviathan, Cambridge University Press, 2010, 183pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521197243.

Reviewed by A. P. Martinich, The University of Texas at Austin


Susanne Sreedhar's thesis is that according to Hobbes subjects have the right to rebel; that is, they collectively have the right to resist their sovereign when in their judgment he is a threat to their survival. This is, or at least appears to be, much stronger than the thesis that a subject has a right to defend herself against immediate threats to her life whatever the source, including her sovereign or the sovereign's agents. I think that Hobbes would agree with the latter thesis, but I am highly doubtful that he would accept the former. In Leviathan, the explicit terms of the social contract are that people give up their right to make the kinds of decisions that would be necessary for them to rebel; they give up such a right when they give up the right to govern themselves. If the proposition that subjects have a right to rebel had been put to Hobbes, he would have denied it. Sreedhar knows this because she implies that Hobbes is not to be taken "at his word" (133).

Hobbes's imagined denial that subjects have a right to rebel leaves open the possibility that, contrary to his own intentions, certain principles of his philosophy entail a conclusion that he did and would not have wanted to defend. Given such a denial, he would have been a rebel theorist in spite of himself. Certain royalist intellectuals in effect thought this, and one of them, John Bramhall, claimed that Hobbes's principles justified calling Leviathan, "a Rebel's catechism." Something like this view has been impressively argued by Jean Hampton, and Sreedhar sensibly takes Hampton's position seriously (103-8). Hampton argued that it is impossible "for people to authorize an absolute sovereign while at the same time reserving to themselves the right to resist under certain circumstances" (103). She concluded that "this problem is so serious that it renders the entire Hobbesian justification for absolute sovereignty invalid."[1] While Hampton was right to argue that Hobbes's principles entail the right to rebel, it is not correct to say that his justification for absolute sovereignty is "invalid." If Hobbes's principles are contradictory, as I think they are, then they entail both that individuals have a right to rebel and that the sovereign is absolute. In fact Hampton does say that some of Hobbes's principles contradict others (104).

Hobbes's argument is logically valid but not cogent. If one wants to preserve absolute sovereignty, as I'm sure Hobbes did, then one needs to tighten at least one of his principles. One good candidate, which Hobbes appeals to at crucial points, is the right-to-the-means principle: Whoever has a right to the end has a right to the means to that end. But that principle is too strong and would need to be weakened. Alternatively, one might hold that subjects retain the right to defend themselves against immediate attacks. However, this right fails to provide a position from which they could organize with others to mount a rebellion. The right to rebellion is not a retained right because subjects give up the other rights necessary for exercising a right to rebel.

One way for Hampton to argue that rights to long-term planning for self-defense are retained is to appeal to other rights that Hobbes says are retained, such as the right to avoid being wounded by another or the right to resist imprisonment (106). The standard explanation for why one retains a right not to be wounded or imprisoned is that it allows one to avoid situations that may very likely lead to death.

Sreedhar does not accept the standard explanation. She says, "Hobbes's original formulation … makes it sound as though it were literally impossible, within the confines of right reason, to see death as anything other than the greatest evil, this is an overstatement" (46). She thinks that one is quite able to accept wounds or be imprisoned without being in danger of death. I think she is too sanguine about this. As a matter of prudence, at least in the seventeenth century, being wounded put one in great danger of death, especially because of the high probability of infection and the absence of antibiotics (cf. 61-2); and being imprisoned at that time was a handy prelude to execution, as the cases of Sir Walter Raleigh, Lord Strafford, William Laud and Charles I show. However, the prudential point is not apposite. A point of reason is. To paraphrase what Hobbes said to the Foole, who thought he should sometimes not keep a covenant, it is not rational to count on surviving a wound or imprisonment. However, Sreedhar does not want to trace the retained rights to avoid wounds and imprisonment back to the right of self-preservation because she wants to establish that there is a wide range of retained rights, a range that includes the right of rebellion.

In addition to trying to defend an implausible thesis, Sreedhar's case is marred by too many imprecise or incorrect statements. Chapter 1, "Hobbes's right of self-defense" is not precisely about self-defense, as she later admits (11); it is about self-preservation. She says that "the right of self-defense can be exercised even in the absence of a direct attack" (8). Her comment suggests that a person may protect oneself from an indirect attack, a view that Hobbes does not endorse because subjects give up the right of governing themselves. The evidence that she adduces to support her claim, a passage about the right one has "by the terror of present death," does not substantiate it (8; Leviathan 27.24). The passage is about an immediate threat to one's life. She says as much herself in the process of making her point more precise. She mentions the "right to take whatever actions one judges necessary to avoid an immediate threat of death" (8), and follows it with the comment, "Strictly speaking, then, 'right of self-defense' is a bit of a misnomer" (9). In her precise formulation, only the right against immediate threats is retained. Since rebellion requires foreseeing dangers that are not immediate, the right to defend against immediate threats does not allow her what she needs and wants, the thin edge of a wedge argument into a solid block of doctrine against rebellion.

Because the phrase "a right to self-defense" connotes a right that is well on the way to a right to resist the sovereign, its use is tendentious. What Hobbes says and what Sreedhar concedes he means is that subjects retain a right to prevent immediate death. In the state of nature, any near- or far-term threat can be avoided by right. But in the civil state, only the right to preserve one's life from imminent danger is retained. That is quite different from a right to rebel. Since "self-preservation" is the correct, precise, and familiar word for what Sreedhar means, it should have been used.

Sreedhar claims that Hobbes's "account of covenants" is best understood in the light of three principles: the reasonable expectations principle is that "a covenant is valid if and only if each party can reasonably expect every other party to perform their part of the covenant" (40). The fidelity principle is that "the transfer of a right has to be faithful to the purpose of the covenant; that is, one cannot transfer a right when the transfer contradicts (or undermines) the purpose for which that right is transferred" (41). The necessity principle is that "one only transfers those rights that are necessary to achieve the purpose of the covenant" (49). Understood in one way, these are helpful points about Hobbes's view about covenants. But the reasonable expectations principle does not seem to apply to the supposed case of a parent covenanting to die in exchange for the release of her daughter (38). What reasonable expectation is there that a fiend who would kidnap a child would keep his word?

In chapter 2, "The true liberties of subjects," Sreedhar argues that liberty rights are best understood as permission rights rather than Hohfeldian liberty rights. This idea is introduced in the "Introduction" with the explanation that if a person has a permission right to do X, then "one does nothing wrong when one does X, nor does one have an obligation to refrain from doing X" (14).[2] The issue could be avoided with no loss of clarity by explaining liberty rights as those which contravene no law. It fits with Hobbes's own comment that "law and right differ as much as obligation and liberty" (Leviathan, 14.3).

A central part of chapter 3, "Limited obedience to an unlimited sovereign," is Sreedhar's use of Joseph Raz's concept of authority to provide second-order exclusionary reasons. Essentially, the strategy is to show that certain aspects of Hobbes's theory can be re-described in terms of certain aspects of Raz's conceptually more involved or more sophisticated theory. This then supposedly justifies using Raz's theory as if it were Hobbes's own, a move she then proceeds to make. Pace Sreedhar, Hobbes has no concept of the authority of a sovereign being a second-order exclusionary reason. And the quotation she uses from Leviathan (29.6, on pp. 115-16) does not support her claim that his apparatus includes exclusionary reasons in this sense. For Hobbes, the "poisonous doctrine" that "every private man is judge of good and evil actions" is false because each subject has given up the right to judge of good and evil. It is that simple. Hobbes "excludes" those rights, but that is not the same as committing himself to a technical sense of "exclusionary reasons."

One conclusion that Sreedhar draws from her use of Raz is that "Hobbes, like Raz, is not committed to the claim that people do not use prudential reasons when deciding whether or not to obey the law" (115). I don't remember anyone claiming that Hobbes thought people do not rely on prudence. His reply to the fool involves his explanation of how, under the conditions he describes, it is rational for everyone to keep their covenants (Leviathan 15.4-5).

According to Sreedhar, "the right of self-defense cannot be transferred in the social contract" (47). If this is correct, then it seems to entail that subjects have little or no obligation to obey the sovereign. Sreedhar does not count this as a problem for her position. That is the point of her chapter title, "Limited obedience to an unlimited sovereign." She holds, "Hobbes's sovereign is absolute … in that he can command with impunity," but subjects have restricted obligations to obey (129). It's a quite condescending view of absolute sovereignty: "Certainly, King James, you have authority to command as you wish, and we have the right to do as we wish." She would have been on firmer ground if she had offered her interpretation as an attack on the cogency of Hobbes's theory.

To the question that forms the title of chapter 4, "Is Leviathan a 'rebel's catechism'?," she answers in effect that it is, although "catechism" should not have pejorative associations. She claims Hobbes commits himself "to a right of rebellion" (139). At one point she argues "if people are justified in continuing a rebellion out of regard for their self-preservation [as they are], then there is no reason to think they are not justified in starting one for the same reason" (141; see also 149). In another context, this is the red-light-runner's defense: "Since I had a right to continue going through the red light (once I entered the intersection), I must have had a right to run the red light in the first place."

Hobbes is quite clear in holding that the initial act of rebelling is unjust. So I wish that Sreedhar had said that she thought that Hobbes was inconsistent on this point (cf. 137 and 143). She then could have made a similar move when she said that he believes that "a subject has no obligation to obey a sovereign if he judges that the sovereign is not providing for his security" (139). Such reserved judgment is inconsistent with the right of private judgment and the right of conscience, which Hobbes identifies as the second and third "things that weaken a commonwealth" (Leviathan 29.6 and 7).

The secondary literature on Hobbes's philosophy is enormous, and no one can be expected to take account of it all. Nonetheless, Sreedhar should have considered a broader range of interpretations and should have given more weight to the evidence against her interpretation.

This review has focused on the distinctive theses that Sreedhar argues for in Hobbes on Resistance. Her expositions of Hobbes's views leading up to her theses are generally clear and accurate.[3]

[1] Jean Hampton (1986), Hobbes and the Social Contract Tradition (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press), p. 197; quoted by Sreedhar, p. 104.

[2] See also Eleanor Curran (2006), "Lost in Translation: Some Problems with a Hohfeldian Analysis of Hobbesian Rights," Hobbes Studies 9: 58-76.

[3] Jonathan Vanderhoek helpfully commented on this review.