Holding and Letting Go: The Social Practice of Personal Identities

Placeholder book cover

Hilde Lindemann, Holding and Letting Go: The Social Practice of Personal Identities, Oxford University Press, 2014, 219pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199754922.

Reviewed by Marian Verkerk, University of Groningen


In this book Hilde Lindemann shows us that good philosophy needs good writing, but also that good writing can contribute to good philosophy. Lindemann has become well known as a philosopher and bioethicist in her contribution to narrative approaches to moral philosophy and bioethics. In her earlier book Damaged Identities, Narrative Repair (Cornell University Press, 2001) she developed her view on the narrative construction of identity and showed how persons can be damaged by so-called master narratives that portray the social group to which they belong as morally inferior: for example, that women are too emotional to become good mathematicians or gay men only think about sex. These damaged identities can be rehabilitated by counterstories that represent the person in a more accurate and respect-worthy light. By concentrating on those stories and the master narratives they counter, the focus of that book was on the social groups in which a person develops his or her identity. In this new book she concentrates more on the flipside of that same narrative approach: the individual person.

In Lindeman's words, the book is about the moral practice of "initiating human beings into personhood and then holding them there" (p. ix). We hold others and ourselves through a web of stories that depict our most important acts, experiences, characteristics, roles, relationships, and commitments. This narrative tissue, as she calls it, constitutes our personal identities. So storytelling is of essential importance for the moral practice of personhood and identity work. Interestingly, she practices what she preaches. Each chapter starts with a story that shows us how persons can be held or let go. In those stories she shows herself to be a good short storyteller (we can hope that someday she will publish a collection of short stories). In this book, as perhaps in those stories, her philosophical approach centers around three important concepts: (1) the person, (2) his or her identity, and (3) moral agency.

Let me start with the concept of a person. The question whether someone is a person is a typical philosophical one. It is often seen as the basis for morality. When we can call someone a person, she deserves our moral respect and has accordingly fundamental moral rights that need to be recognized. But who should be called and recognized as a person? Is it those sentient beings that are able to feel pain? Or should we reserve the term for beings capable of rational reflection or self-consciousness? The argument seems to be that once we know who should be seen as a person, we then know how we should behave toward her morally. Interestingly, Lindemann changes the moral order here: it is morality itself that holds someone as a person or lets her go. In line with other philosophers such as Cora Diamond and Carl Elliott she argues that "it is the treating of someone that makes that someone a person" (p. 11). In short, she seems to believe that we do not think subjects as persons, but we do them in a moral and social way. That also explains why she says that she pities philosophers for investigating whether someone is a person or not (p. 10). People are persons because we treat them as persons. Still we can wonder, can anybody become a person? Can dogs or cats, too? Lindemann seems to reserve the term 'person' for those that share the human life that we all lead. Morality is therefore connected to the idea that we are a moral community of humans who try to live as best as we can, and we do that, in part, by holding each other in personhood.

We hold each other in personhood by maintaining or constructing an identity. It is here the storytelling comes in. In Damaged Identities, Narrative Repair Lindemann characterized personal identities as narratively constituted: "They consist of tissues of stories and fragments of stories, generated from both first- and third-person perspectives, that cluster around what we take to be our own or others' most important acts, experiences, characteristics, roles, relationships, and commitments." These stories display the various facets of who the person is.

Treating someone as a person therefore means recognizing and responding to someone as he is. And that recognition is narrative; the person is represented as a web of stories. This social and moral practice of personhood is a dynamic process that develops itself over time, as we are not frozen in our identities. We change our own first-person stories over time, as do others, who change the stories of how they see us.

Lastly, personal identities also play an important role in Lindemann's third important moral philosophical concept: moral agency. Identity and moral agency are connected in at least two ways. For one thing, they factor largely in the practices of responsibility and accountability that constitute morality. Here Lindemann follows Margaret Walker's view on morality (Moral Understandings, Oxford, 1998). As morality is something we do -- and do together -- it sets up normative expectations regarding who is responsible for what, or accountable to whom. Identities contain those social and moral rules. But identities also express who we are in moral terms. So, as children acquire moral agency, they not only have to get a feel for whose identity requires what response, but also have to become aware of what their actions say to others about who they are, with the knowledge that they will be treated accordingly. In fact, there should be a fit, according to Lindemann, between my identity and my agency that goes in both directions: if it's true that I act out of the tissue of stories that constitute my sense of who I am, it's just as true that I express who I am by how I act. My actions, then, are important criteria for assessing the accuracy of my self-conception.

I think there is much to be learned and gained from her approach on the social and moral practice of personhood, especially in cases when subjects cannot have moral agency, as the touching story about her sister, Carla, shows. It was doubtful that Carla was capable of forming a self-conception. The narrative tissue that constituted her personal identity contained no stories of her own. Was Carla a person? Of course she was, says Lindemann. Her parents, siblings, and Lindemann herself treated her as a person, narratively constructing her identity and thereby holding her in personhood. And in holding her, her family learned what morality means. It is precisely this that makes the approach of Lindemann so interesting: in doing persons, we also do morality. As Lindeman's mother writes after Carla died: "We are all the richer because we were permitted to have her these eighteen months, as in that time we learned so much from her about love, compassion, and patience" (p. 30).

I am a bit less convinced by her approach when it comes to holding someone in personhood where first- and third-person stories conflict. What if I see myself as a compassionate and caring person, while others would describe me as a narcissist who only cares for others because it makes her feel good? Saying, as Lindemann does in connecting agency and identity, that my actions will show the accuracy of my self-conception does not help here. In both instances I do what I do: care for others, but for different reasons and motives. The way we see ourselves can be built on illusions. We sometimes tell ourselves stories so that we can live with ourselves, but that is not the same as saying that this is what we are.

This critical thought is connected to another one: her treatment of the person as an embodied person. Although Lindemann speaks about an embodied person, she seems to understand the embodiment in terms of the person having a body. But persons are bodies as well. To be more precise, bodies are before they speak and are spoken about, as Jackie Leach Scully writes in her book on Disability Bioethics. We do morality in embodied consciousness and un- or preconsciousness. Being my authentic self asks that I also feel myself as the person I am. My body will react in sometimes destructive ways once I try, in my acts and stories, to be someone that I am not. In short, as the story-telling animals we persons are, the story should feel right. But it is also the other way round: we can hold someone in personhood, not only by telling stories, but also by holding them in their bodies.

Lindemann shows us that by telling each other and ourselves stories we make good moral philosophy. The practice of personhood serves as an example of how to live a human life. That life may not be perfect, it may be misshapen and damaged, but it is our human life. The same can be said of Lindemann's book. It is how philosophy should be done: it may be here and there unfinished, it may be seen as an invitation to fill in the sketch, as she says, but it is how moral philosophy should be done.