Hollywood Westerns and American Myth: The Importance of Howard Hawks and John Ford for Political Philosophy

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Robert B. Pippin, Hollywood Westerns and American Myth: The Importance of Howard Hawks and John Ford for Political Philosophy, Yale University Press, 2010, 198pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780300145779.

Reviewed by Thomas E. Wartenberg, Mount Holyoke College


In recent years, philosophers have begun mining films for their philosophical insights. Although some remain skeptical about whether films can add to the body of philosophical knowledge, others have been keen to demonstrate that films -- and, indeed, other artistic mediums -- can enrich the practice of philosophy. Part of what remains at issue is exactly how a careful study of individual films can add to our understanding of specific philosophical issues.

Robert B. Pippin's concise study of Hollywood Westerns, Hollywood Westerns and American Myth, promises to be an interesting contribution to this debate. Pippin claims that the great Westerns make an essential contribution to political philosophy, specifically to our understanding of what he calls "political psychology," by which he means the way in which human beings, with their complex structure of passion and desire, are suited or not to the political structures within which they find themselves. Indeed, he thinks that paying attention to what Westerns have to say about this can enrich what he takes to be the reductive focus on much contemporary political philosophy on the question of legitimacy, i.e., what justifies the state's monopoly of coercive power.

Pippin's book consists of five chapters: an introduction that outlines his claims and also contains a short discussion of John Ford's Stagecoach (1939); three chapters on individual films: the first on Howard Hawks' 1948 film, Red River, the second on Ford's 1962 film, The Man Who Shot Liberty Valance, with an additional discussion of Fred Zinneman's High Noon (1952), and the third on Ford's 1956 classic, The Searchers; and a conclusion that discusses Nicolas Ray's The Lusty Men (1952). Although Pippin gives interesting interpretations of the films, he intends to do more than just illuminate the structure of these interesting Westerns. As we have seen and as the subtitle of his book suggests, Pippin thinks that what he has to say about these films makes an actual contribution to political philosophy.

Pippin's book is difficult to review because his interpretations of individual films are extremely nuanced and intricate. There is simply not enough space to delve into even one of them in adequate detail. In addition, his general claims about the philosophical significance of the Western can only be assessed once one has understood his interpretations. Nonetheless, I hope to be able to give the reader a sense of how interesting his take on the Western is and shall begin by discussing Pippin's interpretations of the films. After all, if his argument is to gain any purchase, we have to be convinced by his account of the seriousness and merit of these films.

The Western is an important genre of Hollywood filmmaking. Westerns generally take place in the post-Civil War era and raise a number of very important issues about the nature of American society. Among them are the following: because they take place shortly after the Civil War, Westerns are concerned with the question of how to heal the wounds created by that devastating conflict. Because they take place in the American West, they must come to terms with the question of whether America's westward expansion justified the forced eviction of the indigenous population. Finally, because the settlement of the West entailed the introduction of modern commercial society with its intricate system of law and order, Westerns deal with the question of what the effects of such a change are on the lived lives of human beings.

Thus, despite important pioneering essays on the Western by Andre Bazin and Robert Warshow, there has been a tendency in the discipline of film studies to treat the Western as ideological and, hence, not to take individual films in the genre seriously. Alternatively, Westerns are taken to be disguised ways of discussing concerns contemporary to their makers, such as McCarthyism. Pippin intends to counter these sorts of views by showing that the visions put forward in at least the great Westerns need to be taken seriously as significant reflections on American social and political life.

As I noted, Pippin discusses only six Westerns in any detail. What he has to say about these specific films is probing. He notes that these are all great films, but he doesn't explain why he has chosen these six specific films nor whether there are many other such great films in the corpus of roughly 7,000 films in this genre, although he does refer to a number of other Westerns to support his claims. Pippin does acknowledge that the majority of Westerns are B-films (especially those on television) and thus don't rise to the level of the films he discusses.

Pippin's discussions of the individual films are often quite brilliant. He sees Howard Hawks' Red River as a film about problems of rule and authority. There is no doubt that Thomas Dunson (John Wayne) was a successful rancher, although we don't see how he managed to transform the land from open prairie to successful cattle ranch. But it is equally clear that, when faced with having to get his cattle to market in a do-or-die situation, he becomes as obsessive and cruel a ruler as Captain Ahab, the literary character to whom he is often compared. His adopted son, Matt Garth (Montgomery Clift) is criticized for being "soft," but proves to be a more effective leader, working together with his men rather than lording it over them.

For Pippin, the film is clearly about the transition from a society where rugged individualists could prosper to the modern commercial society that demands different virtues of its leaders. But he interestingly points out that the film ends by showing that the modern society has more of the traditional society within it than it cares to admit, thus making the transition less of a radical break than its proponents would acknowledge. This claim is important to him, for it demonstrates the need for a careful, nuanced, and sensitive interpretation of these films.

The narrative structure of The Man Who Shot Liberty Valance enables it to present a clear contrast between the modern, commercial world of Shinbone, where its framing story takes place, and the older, wilder world that it has replaced. In so doing, the film is able to take a critical stance in regard to the bringing of law and order to the West. What superficially might be taken for progress and modernization is presented in the film as coming at the cost of a diminution in the character of the men who inhabit the modernized West.

This is nowhere clearer than in the film's contrast between Dutton Peabody (Edmund O'Brien), the crusading editor of the Shinbone Star -- who is willing to risk his life in order to expose the villainy of the ranchers and their henchman, Liberty Valance -- and Maxwell Scott (Carleton Young), Peabody's successor. Faced with a tale that reveals that the legal structure of Shinbone is founded on a lie and a crime, Scott blithely replies, "This is the West, sir. When the legend becomes fact, print the legend."

As Pippin notes, Liberty Valance is less a film that provides us with a mythic account of the founding of Shinbone as a modern, commercial society than it is a commentary on such foundational myths, such as the one about "The Man Who Shot Liberty Valance." What the film shows is that such mythological accounts render invisible the real sacrifices that individuals made to allow the regulated world of law and order to prosper. This is because the acts that are necessary to create that world actually violate its norms and hence must be covered in myths.

Finally, let's consider Pippin's account of The Searchers. This film takes place shortly after the Civil War, with the renegade Rebel, Ethan Edwards (John Wayne), as its star. When renegade Comanches murder Edwards' brother's family, Ethan vows to track down the leader of the band, Scar (Henry Brandon). When he finds out that Scar has taken his niece Debbie (Natalie Wood) as his wife, Ethan is determined to kill her because that would be preferable to her present state.

Pippin's interpretation of Ethan's surprising decision not to kill Debbie when he rescues her is one of the highpoints of his book. He shows that we need to understand this act very carefully, for it brings together a wealth of themes: issues about vengeance, the nature of self-understanding, racism and projection, the possibility of self-deception, among others. Pippin then uses his account of this climactic scene in the film to show that Ford is raising questions about "the smugness and complacency and blindness of the white civilized world" (p. 140).

It is now time to ask why Pippin thinks that his discussion of these films actually amount to doing political philosophy. For an answer, we need to turn to the first chapter of his book. There, he indicates, as I have mentioned, that he believes that the focus of contemporary political philosophy on the question of legitimacy is deeply problematic. This is because he thinks that such a focus neglects what he calls "political psychology." There are a range of human passions (emotions?) -- love, fear (especially of death), desire for ease, and what might be called vanity or self-love -- that Pippin claims are relevant to questions of political philosophy. This is because political philosophy should not just address the question of what the rational or best structure of society should be, it should also, according to Pippin, be asking questions about how different forms of society are suitable or not to the human beings who inhabit them and what sorts of human beings those societies create.

In order to make the case for this enlargement of the task of political philosophy, Pippin thinks we need to make reference to works of art and, specifically, films. He presents us with a clear summary of his contentions in the following list of theses he claims to defend in his book:

(i) Political psychology is essential to any worthwhile political philosophy. (ii) The sort of political psychology necessary cannot be properly understood as an empirical social science. (iii) It must reflect an understanding of the experiential or first-personal dimension of political experience, and that means it must involve a complex, historically inflected interpretive task … . (iv) Novels and films and other artworks are essential, not incidental or merely illustrative, elements of such a task. (v) Most controversial of all, such interpretive work … is itself philosophical work (pp. 15-16).

This is a bold set of theses for a short book to defend. And though I find Pippin's discussion of individual films sensitive and nuanced, I do have some concerns about the adequacy of the defense he makes of these general claims.

The first concern I have is how he justifies taking the films he considers to illuminate general truths about political life. One reason for my worry is that Pippin wavers between claiming that the films show us general truths about society and arguing that the films display features of "the distinctly American imaginary" (11). If we take his claim about the uniquely American nature of the films seriously -- and it makes sense to do so since he is dealing with American Westerns -- then it's hard to see how he can justify his assertion that the films have implications for political philosophy in general rather than more specific implications for the nature of America as a particular type of society.

More generally, I have worries about how Pippin justifies taking these particular films to have broad implications for political philosophy. In a way, Pippin here follows in the footsteps of Hegel who took Greek dramas to illuminate shortcomings in Greek society. Unlike Pippin, however, Hegel justified his view because he had a general theory of Greek society. That is, Hegel could take Sophocles' Antigone to have broad implications for political philosophy because he interpreted the characters of the play to stand for abstract roles or principles that he saw as essential to Greek society. Thus, Hegel is able to justify his treating the conflict between Antigone and Creon over her flouting his authority by symbolically burying her brother to have broader philosophical significance because he sees the two characters not as individuals but as embodying abstract principles essential to Greek society.

Now Pippin does say that Westerns involve types and not individuals in their mythic portrayals of western history. But what I don't see is an account of how the films' use of these types connects to questions of political philosophy or psychology in general. The Man Who Shot Liberty Valance does show, at least on Pippin's interpretation, that a man who possessed heroic virtues and who sacrificed himself to allow for the modernization of the territory in which he lived is forgotten by that very society; what I am not clear about is what justifies Pippin in claiming that the film shows us that the advance of modern commercial society in general comes at a cost, namely that of making irrelevant people with the traditional virtues of pride and heroism.

What I am asking for is a more general account of how narratives like the films Pippin considers are (as he puts it) "essential, not incidental or merely illustrative, elements of such a task" – the task, namely, of determining "what matters to people at a place and time, why it matters, what matters more than other things … , what they are willing to sacrifice for, what provokes intense anger, and so forth." (p. 15) That is, why does a fictional story entail general truths about what people are like in general and how they react to different social and political arrangements? Although Pippin does make some general comments about this in the first chapter, I do not find them adequate, and he does not address this issue in a general form anywhere else in the book.

But such worries do not detract from the impressiveness of Pippin's study of Hollywood Westerns. His readings establish the seriousness and quality of some of the central films in that genre. Anyone interested in the philosophical import of films and works of art more generally should definitely read this book.